Freedom and Nature in Schelling's Philosophy of Art

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Devin Zane Shaw, Freedom and Nature in Schelling's Philosophy of Art, Continuum, 2010, 175pp., $120.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781441156242.

Reviewed by Jason M. Wirth, Seattle University


This is a dense and compact reading of an important strand of ideas in Schelling's thinking, spanning his early to mid period (1795-1810). Shaw takes up Schelling's better known and appreciated works on freedom and Nature-philosophy and interlaces them with the lesser known but critically important work on the philosophy of art, which Shaw, rightly I think, argues "is central to his thought" (2).

The philosophy of art, according to Shaw, "plays a dual role" in Schelling's thinking. Firstly, "artistic activity produces through the artwork a sensible realization of the ideas of philosophy" (1). Secondly, it also "creates the possibility of a new mythology" (1) that can overcome social alienation. The latter has two conflicting tendencies.  First, there is the danger of an all-encompassing ideology that does not, as someone like Jacques Rancière would insist, address, as democratic politics should, the part of the whole that has no part. Or as Shaw articulates it: "one can participate through a public set of rituals and beliefs without participating in the structures of political empowerment" (137).  Second, there is a utopian promise at the heart of the production of a work of art, a promise whose salutary reverberations are still felt today.

I will briefly examine both trajectories of this "dual role" of Schelling's philosophy of art and then end with a question.

Schelling's early, or so-called negative philosophy, moves from our first experience of nature, where everything appears to happen in accordance with necessity (i.e., following natural laws) to an intuition of freedom at the ground of all rules. As Schelling posed the question in the 1797 Von der Weltseele, "How can nature in its blind lawfulness lay claim to the appearance of freedom, and alternately, in appearing to be free, how can it obey a blind lawfulness" (I/6, ix)? The works of Naturphilosophie move through things beyond things, always moving über etwas hinaus. The aesthetic intuition, however, moves in the opposite direction as "art presents and produces the absolute in the finite world" (4). One could say that, for Schelling, art and transcendental reflection complete one another. The latter moves from the ironclad domain of forms moving according to laws into the freedom at the heart of rule-bound forms. The former moves in the opposite direction, and "the artwork . . . presents [darstellen] the infinite in finite form" (81). This "infinite characteristic of art is based in (1) the lack of an external rule leading to its creation, meaning the artwork presents its own rule;  and (2) the cessation of striving, resulting in 'calm, and silent grandeur'" (81).

Schelling's Nature-philosophy moves toward freedom within the heart of necessity, and the artwork moves from freedom to the unexpected and surprising emergence of new form. That is, nature philosophy begins with natura naturata, nature having come into what it is, and reveals within it natura naturans, nature freely coming into form, nature producing itself from itself. Schelling insists, however, that the two modes of nature are not freestanding, but rather two sides of a dynamic process. With the artwork, the artist partakes in natura naturans and as such reveals the creativity within the unity of nature. "Aesthetic intuition produces from the identity of subject and object, of conscious (free) and unconscious (natural) activity: it is 'intellectual intuition become objective' through the work of art" (65-66). What is experienced as separate and possibly sundered in Nature-philosophy (freedom and necessity, natura naturans and natura naturata) is revealed as two sides of the same coin in the artwork. "Schelling's philosophy of art reconciles the opposition between theoretical reason and practical reason by demonstrating that the activity of artistic production overcomes the separation of freedom and necessity through the production of the work of art" (79). The genius, who holds together freedom and necessity in artistic creativity, in so doing "produces an objective proof -- the artwork -- for absolute identity" (81).

How then do we think the unity that nature philosophy demonstrates subjectively (i.e., freedom at the ground of necessity) and that aesthetic intuition demonstrates objectively (freedom becoming an unexpected form)? Schelling expansively borrows a key term from Kant to name the unity of nature (testified to inversely by the study of nature and the production of art): the productive imagination. This unifies "intellectual intuition and aesthetic intuition" in that the "former is expressed ideally while the latter is expressed in the real, objectively as the work of art," and as such verifies "the transcendental inquiry" (82). Schelling also creates a neologism for the movement of Einbildungskraft (imagination): Ineinsbildung, what Shaw calls the informing of the infinite into the finite (91) or what Samuel Taylor Coleridge dubbed eisemplasy (from the Greek "εις εν πλάττειν, i.e., to shape into one).

I wholeheartedly agree with Shaw on this point: the philosophy of art is indispensible for Schelling because it provides a valuable clue into the unity of thinking, which, for Schelling, is inseparable from the unity of nature. Shaw makes this case by sketching out Schelling's confrontation with Fichte  the early development of the Nature-philosophy, and then through a consideration of the key texts in this domain. He discusses the 1795 epistolary work on Dogmatism and Criticism (which also glimpses this unity through the structure of Greek tragedy) and the 1800 System, which ends with philosophical reflection being brought before the holy of holies, the spontaneous movement of creativity, so that it can "flow back like so many individual streams into the universal sea of poesy from which they took their source."

Shaw then turns his attention to the lecture courses on the Philosophy of Art (1802-1804), before turning to the critical 1807 Munich address, On the Relationship of the Plastic Arts to Nature. Although literary critics have read this work as a key text for the study of Romanticism, it has, lamentably, been largely unread by English speaking philosophers. For Shaw, "the philosophy of art remains an important aspect of Schelling's philosophy through 1807, a contention which is at odds with the standard interpretation of Schelling's philosophical development" (63). Those whose image of Schelling's thinking is something like an erratic and spontaneous productivity, as he constantly changes his mind and comes up with something new, like to organize Schelling's development into neat stages. Even then, it seems hard to understand how someone could dismiss the importance of art for Schelling at this point when one of his last major published works uses the plastic arts -- literally, the imaginative or bildende arts -- to think the dynamic unity of nature. Shaw’s insistence on the importance of this text is a real contribution.

Moreover, I would go so far as to say that although Schelling developed other trajectories of thought after 1807, he never renounces the importance of art. In his late lectures on modern philosophy, Schelling maintains that philosophy holds together the objectivity of art and the subjectivity of religion, and these are the "three spheres of human activity in which the highest spirit alone manifests itself as such" [On the History of Modern Philosophy, trans. Andrew Bowie (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1994), 128-129].

The second strand in this text is what Shaw presents as the bad news and the good news regarding the political ramifications of Schelling's philosophy of art. Schelling had hoped that the philosophy of art could unite the German-speaking world in a new mythology, beyond its sectarian tendencies and the corruption of a culture that denigrates all value into use-value. Shaw finds this ambition dangerous: "A mythologization of politics is closer to what Marx would call a mystification: an idealization of social relationships . . . it places Bilding or cultivation of peoples or publics over direct or democratic political engagement" (116). Schelling would eventually abandon the project of a new mythology, and not a moment too soon. "That Schelling turns away from the mythologization of politics when he changes his focus to a universal history of religion -- just at the time when German politics becomes increasingly nationalistic -- appears well advised in retrospect" (117).

As much as Schelling dreamed of the unifying force of a new mythology, there is also an undeniable radicality to his insight into the utopian promise of art. In an increasingly globalized and totally administered world, the eruption of freedom testified by the work of art continues to be an inspiring political resource. "On the other hand, the revolutionary and utopian idea of art reemerged in the avant-garde of the 20th century and is still the focus of contemporary debates on the relationship between politics and art" (117). Schelling wrote no treatises on the political, and his passing comments on political matters continue to be a subject of earnest debate. Shaw for his part takes a strong stand: "If my concluding critique . . . is sharp or even polemical, it is only because I think the potential of the revolutionary sequence has yet to be exhausted" (7).

Finally, I would like to end with a question that emerges as a tension in Shaw's book. Shaw correctly observes that nearly all of the historical approaches to Schelling either attempt to elucidate his path of thinking as issuing from a fundamental and abiding source or they characterize it as an erratic assemblage of new beginnings. That is, the second camp interprets him "as a protean thinker endlessly shifting in his philosophy" (86) -- prompting Hegel, for example, to accuse Schelling of conducting his Bildung in public. Schelling should have waited until he arrived at the stability of an infinitely iterative system like the dialectic.

The other view, with which Shaw is sympathetic, and which I regard as critical to appreciating Schelling's accomplishment, holds that he is "a philosopher restlessly unfolding the consequences of one fundamental intuition" (86). In the posthumously published fragment, The Ages of the World (1815), Schelling speaks of "an extremity, below which there is nothing, but it is for us not something ultimate, but something primary, out of which all things begin, an eternal beginning [ein ewiger Anfang]" [The Ages of the World, trans. Jason Wirth (Albany: SUNY Press, 2000), 31]. If this eternal beginning, this inexhaustible natality of the source of philosophy, is Schelling's "fundamental intuition," then does this not give us a different sense of the character of his thinking? Perhaps these are exercises in thinking that emerge from the freedom of thinking? Moreover, Schelling's many positions, despite a single fundamental intuition (a performative sense of the hen kai pan), demands that we think the problem of transition. How do we account, for example, for what Shaw calls Schelling's "theological turn" in which "history is constructed with the inclusion of both the Fall of humanity and Christ's redemption as real events" (147) if we are not going to say that Schelling simply changed his mind? How are we to understand the many products of the eternal beginning (the one)?

Of course, that is a huge question and more properly a line of inquiry for another book. Shaw has given us a thoughtful retrieval of the problem of art that invites us into the epicenter of Schelling's project.