Freedom and Neurobiology: Reflections on Free Will, Language, and Political Power

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John Searle, Freedom and Neurobiology: Reflections on Free Will, Language, and Political Power, Columbia University Press, 2007, 113pp., $24.50 (hbk), ISBN 0231137524.

Reviewed by Alfred R. Mele, Florida State University


Searle reports that "The two lectures published here, one about the problem of free will and neurobiology and the other about language, social ontology, and political power" are not connected at "the level of authorial intent" (3). These lectures, originally published in French, are preceded by a substantial introductory chapter in which, among other things, Searle identifies what he takes to be the "overriding question in contemporary philosophy" (4) and several sub-questions.  The overriding question is this (5): "How can we square [a certain] conception of ourselves as mindful, meaning-creating, free, rational, etc., agents with a universe that consists entirely of mindless, meaningless, unfree, nonrational, brute physical particles?"

"The main question" in Searle's lecture on free will is this (58): "How could we treat the problem of free will as a neurobiological problem?"  There is a rapidly expanding body of neurobiological work on free will.  (For discussion and references see chapter 2 of my Free Will and Luck [Oxford UP, 2006].)  Although Searle has engaged with some of this work elsewhere, he does not do so in this book.  Instead, he examines his issue at a non-empirical, theoretical level.  We can treat "the problem of free will" as at least partly a neurobiological problem by pursuing the following question: How would our brains need to work in order for us to have free will, and what substitutions for "x" and "y" in the following statement, S, would render S true?  (S) If my brain is functioning in way x at a time at which I do A and y is true, then I freely do A (or exercise free will in doing A).

Of course, how this question is to be answered depends on what free will is.  Compatibilists claim that free will is compatible with determinism, the thesis that a complete statement of the laws of nature together with a complete description of the condition of the entire universe at any point in time logically entails a complete description of the condition of the entire universe at any other point in time.  (A description of what you and I are doing at this moment is part of a complete description of the universe at this moment.)  If compatibilists are right, then my brain's functioning deterministically does not preclude my having free will.  But Searle sets compatibilism aside, reporting that "according to the definitions … that I am using, determinism and free will are not compatible" (47).  Furthermore, in his view, "quantum indeterminism" in the world around us "gives us no help with the free will problem" (44): we need to be internally indeterministic.

This brings us to "the gap," a notion familiar to readers of Searle's Rationality in Action (MIT Press, 2001).  Searle claims that "In typical cases of deliberating and acting, there is … a gap, or a series of gaps, between the causes of each stage in the processes of deliberating, deciding and acting, and the subsequent stages" (42).  "The gap" here, he says, "can be divided into different sorts of segments" (42). 

There is a gap [1] between the reasons for the decision and the making of the decision, [2] between the decision and the onset of the action, and [3] for any extended action … between the onset of the action and its continuation to completion. (42) 

In each of these places, we do not "sense the antecedent causes" of the next conscious state as "setting causally sufficient conditions" for that state (42).  Searle contends that "The conscious experiences of the gap give us the conviction of human freedom" (43).  And, for him, if we are to act freely, these experiences must not be illusory: the causation at these junctures must be nondeterministic.

So we face a question (59):  If this gap is not an illusion, "how might [it] be reflected at the neurobiological level?"  According to a hypothesis that makes room for free will, as Searle conceives of it, "the absence of causally sufficient conditions at the psychological level is matched by an absence of causally sufficient conditions at the neurobiological level" (62).  In Searle's view, if we have free will, then "The brain is such that the conscious self is able to make and carry out decisions in the gap, where neither decision nor action is determined in advance, by causally sufficient conditions, yet both are rationally explained by the reasons the agent is acting on" (73).  This, Searle says,

raises the trickiest question: How could the gap be neurobiologically real …?  Assume we have an account of how the brain produces mental causation, and an account of how it produces the experiences of rational agency, how would we get rational indeterminism into our account of brain function? (74) 

Searle's proposal is that "Consciousness manifests quantum indeterminism" (75) and that "randomness at the micro level does not by itself imply randomness at the system level" (76).

Having reached the end of Searle's lecture on free will, I leap backward to the beginning.  It opens as follows: "The persistence of the traditional free will problem in philosophy seems to me something of a scandal.  After all these centuries of writing about free will, it does not seem to me that we have made very much progress" (37).  Searle does not discuss recent philosophical work on free will.  Maybe he has read it and has judged that it makes little progress, and maybe not.  In any case, the view of free will in the recent literature that Searle's view most resembles is Robert Kane's (see Kane, The Significance of Free Will [Oxford UP, 1996]).  Readers attracted to Kane's view will also be attracted to Searle's, and those who object to any of the fundamental features of Kane's view will raise the same objections to Searle's view.

Some people think that it is already known that the brain does not work in the way Kane and Searle say it must if we are to have free will.  For example, according to David Hodgson, "in systems as hot, wet, and massive as neurons of the brain, quantum mechanical indeterminacies quickly cancel out, so that for all practical purposes determinism rules in the brain" ("Quantum Physics, Consciousness, and Free Will," in R. Kane, ed., The Oxford Handbook of Free Will [Oxford UP, 2002], 86).  Others -- neurobiologist Benjamin Libet, for example -- insist that this is not known (see his Mind Time [Harvard UP, 2004]).  Suppose it were discovered that Hodgson is right.  Would it be correct to conclude that no one has free will?  Would careful consideration of compatibilism be in order?  (For discussion, see my Free Will and Luck, ch. 8.)  Whereas Kane tries to show that compatibilism is unacceptable, Searle excludes it by definition.

I turn to Searle's second lecture, "Social Ontology and Political Power."  Its aim is to "explore some of the relations between the general ontology of social reality and the specific form of social reality that is political power" (80).  This lecture is linked to the lecture on free will by Searle's vision of the "overriding question in contemporary philosophy."  Part of what "etc." holds a place for in the closing quotation of my first paragraph is our conception of ourselves as "social and political agents" (81).  Much of the technical apparatus that Searle needs in order to set the stage for the answer he offers to the social and political part of the "overriding question" is familiar to readers of his The Construction of Social Reality (The Free Press, 1995).  Indeed, as Searle says, the second lecture is an attempt to apply the "account of institutional reality" offered in the 1995 book to the issue of political power.

About two-thirds of the way through this lecture, Searle writes: "Because I do not have a lot of space I am going to summarize some of the essential points about political power as a set of numbered propositions" (98).  Because I have much less space than Searle did, I will quote from Searle's concluding summary of "some of the distinguishing features of the political" (109).

The concept of the political requires a distinction between the public and the private spheres, with the political as the preeminent public sphere."  The political "requires the existence of group conflicts settled by non-violent means, and it requires that the group conflict be over social goods.

Furthermore, "the whole system has to be backed by a credible threat of armed violence.  Governmental power is not the same as police power and military power, but with few exceptions, if no police and no army, then no government."

I am not qualified to assess the progress Searle makes in his second lecture.  For example, I do not know enough about the literature on political power to know whether it includes superior alternatives to Searle's position or positions that are very similar to Searle's.  Regarding his first lecture, I can add that, in my opinion, it does not take us beyond Kane's 1996 book.