Freedom and Reason in Kant

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Michelle Kosch, Freedom and Reason in Kant, Schelling and Kierkegaard, Oxford University Press, 2006, 236pp., $65.00 (cloth), ISBN 0199289115.

Reviewed by Alistair Welchman, University of Texas, San Antonio


Kosch attempts to show that post-Kantian German idealism duplicates and exacerbates a kind of intelligible determinism that is incompatible with a muscular conception of human freedom. Schelling, in his Freedom essay of 1809, finally recognized this; and his attempt to reconfigure idealism from within was motivated by his recognition of the need to provide a place for human freedom. The attempt failed (even if interestingly) but is taken up again and more successfully by Kierkegaard. While the account of Kant draws on a quite familiar interpretive matrix, the application of this matrix to Schelling and Kierkegaard is novel, fruitful, compelling and extremely rigorously laid out. The book is written in a dense and very scholarly analytical style, freely deploying original sources in both German and Danish. It still bears some of the marks of its provenance as a Ph.D. dissertation.

For many people (Kant included) there is something wrong with a picture of the world in which every event is determined by the events prior to it: it leaves no space for us as human beings to be practically engaged with the world, to be agents. If true, then my next action is not in fact my action, or anyone's action. It just happens.

In the Groundwork (1785) Kant argues that it is simply impossible for us to conceive ourselves as unfree. We must view ourselves as able to set aside all empirical motives (causes), even when we choose in fact to do what we want. The argument is quite subtle (he never takes it as establishing that we actually are free). But the fact that we cannot escape thinking of ourselves as free is enough to establish that the moral law actually binds us. Kosch wants to interpret Kant as offering something like a transcendental argument against empirical determinism based on this simple phenomenology of free action. In other words, free action imposes transcendental constraints on metaphysics. Some metaphysical views are incompatible with agency and cannot therefore be possible beliefs for a free agent.

Kosch's central conceptual insight is that the category of metaphysical positions that must be rejected on the basis of a deep understanding of the conditions of agency is wider than just that of empirical determinism. One might call this spectrum of metaphysical positions necessitarian (although Kosch doesn't). And the first thing she does is show that Kant himself falls prey to one of these species of necessitarianism. So, although Kant's conception of freedom escapes the frying pan of causal determinism, it can only do so by falling into the fire of another form of necessitarianism.

Kant's problem, for Kosch, lies in his attempt to ground ethics in the structure of practical rationality itself -- not in whether he manages this, but in the malign consequences of the possibility of success. Her interest is therefore not in the conditional: 'if I am rational, then I behave morally'; but rather in 'if I behave immorally, I am irrational.' To be sure, this is not equivalent to submerging action in mere happening. But there are disquieting similarities. For instance, if one acts irrationally (in a fit of madness, say), one is not responsible for one's actions -- they are, in a sense, mere happenings. But then one can only be responsible for moral choices (i.e. choices for behavior in conformity with duty) and not for immoral ones. Perhaps it is not clear whether one is even free to choose rightly in this situation. But it is certainly incompatible with evil, understood as the clear, levelheaded, rational, knowing choice of an immoral act.

Kosch argues that this, the problem of evil (or radical evil in Kant's formulation), is the crucial litmus test of a theory of freedom. To be an agent is to be deeply or transcendentally free, and that means being able to choose evil. Any metaphysical theory must be compatible with this condition, or it excludes agency. Kosch sees here a profound dichotomy between optimistic (ultimately Socratic) theories and Christian theories, starting off with Augustine. Kant, like Socrates, tries to build morality into action itself. But by doing so, some actions become metaphysically impossible, such as (for Socrates) knowingly causing harm, and (for Kant) rationally disobeying the categorical imperative.

Kosch often prefers to focus on the problem of radical evil rather than that of positive necessitation because the case is easier to make out for theories of morality as autonomy or rational self-determination. But it is certainly possible to argue that such theories do more than exclude certain choices. Kant's understanding of intelligible causality as intrinsically law-like suggests that the alternative for Kant is between two types of laws, equally necessary. Kosch shows how these problems were a live concern among Kant's contemporaries, and especially C.E.E. Schmid who, to describe this situation (which Schmid regarded as a reductio of Kant's position), coined the memorable phrase 'intelligible fatalism' (pp. 50f). Schmid's particular account is quite specific, but the idea that Kant is committed to an intelligible as the alternative to a phenomenal determinism is at the center of Kosch's view.

Kosch's picture of the origin of post-Kantian idealism is familiar both from the modern literature and the self-understanding of the protagonists. The dichotomies of Kant's system --most importantly between experience and action -- must be overcome. Kant himself explores the possibility of a common source for theoretical and practical reason through the idea that history is an instrument for achieving moral perfection. Of course this idea has a purely regulative function in Kant's texts; but it is standard to argue that post-Kantian idealism can be understood by now considering the regulative actually to be constitutive of reality. What Kosch observes about this is that Kant's intelligible necessitarianism is now projected onto a cosmic scale, and that in these systems human freedom is understood as conformity to the laws being worked out through history. The systems of German Idealism (including the early Schelling) leave no place for human freedom. The beautiful image that Schelling uses of history as a drama whose rational coordination stems from the fact that each of us is both actor and author is ultimately just as determinist as empirical causality since the tale cannot unfold in any other way.

And this, Kosch argues, is exactly what Schelling comes to see in the Freedom essay. In a sense, Schelling takes Kant's solution to the problem of radical evil in the Religion book to its logical conclusion (where Kant feared to tread because of his more fundamental commitment to autonomy). At the transcendental or intelligible level, each of us makes a core choice for good or evil. Where Kant equivocates on the consequences of this view, Schelling bites the bullet and accepts them. Most importantly, he realizes that he must reject the view that we give the law to ourselves.

The primary interpretive problem that Kosch faces with the Freedom essay is that its focus is apparently cosmological rather than moral. As Kosch puts it, 'at the point in the essay at which he seems obliged to turn to ethics however Schelling turns instead to cosmology' (p. 98). Kosch's strategy here is two-fold. First she regards the cosmological points (and the famous discussion of evil as physical illness) as essentially 'metaphors' (p. 100) for the idea of individual rebellion against (one is tempted to say) 'the system'. This category of rebellion or defiance, rather familiar from English Romanticism, is under-theorized but clearly of some importance to Kosch. It is clear why she needs something like it, however: if the ability to choose between good and evil is (at least) a necessary condition for transcendental freedom, then one must of course be able to defy goodness.

Ultimately Kosch does not feel the need to work all this out in too much detail because of the second aspect of her strategy here, which is to regard the middle period Schelling as an inadequate anticipation of the late Schelling. What is absent in the works from 1809 to 1815 is just the kind of 'metaphysical' empiricism that is required to tell us what (in particular) we ought and ought not to do. For it follows from Schelling's rejection of the Kantian understanding of morality as rational self-determination that whatever it is we ought to do, it doesn't stem from us and is not a function of rational agency. But then where can it come from and what could it be? Kosch treats Schelling's cosmological speculations as a stopgap measure preparing the way for the account of divine revelation he gives in his lectures in the 1830s and 1840s. We should do what god says; and what he says is given only 'empirically' in a revelation that cannot be deduced from his concept and which he could, if he had so chosen, have withheld from us. The fundamental motivation for Schelling's metaphysical empiricism and radical contingency is divine voluntarism about moral values (p. 121). Kosch often exhibits scholarly circumspection here, but certainly reiterates the point that metaphysical indeterminism is the result of the exercise of human freedom choosing evil (e.g. p. 103).

In many ways the Kierkegaard chapters (and especially the first one) are the centerpiece of this book. Kosch's interpretation of Kierkegaard is clear and rigorous; it has a real explanatory depth to it, drawing together anomalies from both the texts themselves and contemporary readings of them and giving a satisfyingly clear indication of what is at issue and why it has been so hard to understand. On Kosch's reading, Kierkegaard is most fundamentally opposed to any system (metaphysical, ethical or 'religious') that does not meet the requirements for deep agency. Here Kosch does not follow secondary commentators, but has a quite new and fresh interpretation.

To give one example: the traditional accounts of the aesthetic 'stage' as it is presented in Either/Or emphasize either the empirical fragility of hedonism or its perversity in relation to some teleological account of human flourishing. While superficially plausible, neither of these is able to make sense of the entire text. In the first case, if it is the thought of the possibility of failure that leads to despair, then this surely applies in spades to the genuinely religious life, where success and failure can barely be distinguished. In the second case it is hard to account for why Kierkegaard thinks that the aesthetic life can be a happy one and impossible to see why on earth 'the German philosophers' (Either/Or, cited p. 147) should be compared with the aesthete.

Kosch's explanation makes everything clear: the aesthetic life is (at its most sophisticated) the view of Schelling's System of Transcendental Idealism, the conception of freedom in history as a drama in which each of us is an individual actor and at the same time co-author. Kierkegaard clearly refers to this analogy from Schelling in Either/Or, which explains why he calls the life 'aesthetic'. Kierkegaard's objection to it is the same as Schelling's (later) objection: since the drama cannot turn out otherwise than it does, the apparent freedom of the actors is nullified. The injunction 'live aesthetically!' cannot be addressed to anyone because the aesthetic life is a life without agents who can respond to injunctions (p. 149). This idea of pure spectatorship (p. 153) could in fact have been developed further: is there not in Kierkegaard some allusion to Kant's aesthetics of disinterest? What about Kant's own scopophilic relation to the political event of his lifetime, the French Revolution? But Kosch's interpretive gesture is immensely compelling here.

This heuristic for understanding Kierkegaard also enables Kosch to give a compelling account both of why Kierkegaard sees the ethical life as superior to the aesthetic and why he sees it as ultimately flawed. The ethical life is superior because in it the subject can recognize itself as an agent with transcendental freedom. Thus the first disjunction of Either/Or is not between two different kinds of goal (hedonistic, moral) but between a necessitarian and hence agentless metaphysics on the one hand, and recognition of oneself as able to choose on the other. However Kosch is also able to explain exactly why in later works Kierkegaard attacks a position that looks very much like the Judge's ethical life from Either/Or. Kierkegaard's target here is exactly the Kantian understanding of an ethics of rational self-determination and autonomy. By making morality a (partial) function of rational agency one also drains the choice out of agency: as for Kant, it is impossible to choose evil because to do so is prima facie evidence that one was not choosing at all. Ethical values cannot be reduced to a function of practical subjectivity -- instead (so Kierkegaard would say) they must come from god.

The success of the Kierkegaard section of this book does however suggest a structural flaw in the overall work. By the end, it becomes retrospectively clear that the analyses of Schelling and Kant are really subordinated to the Kierkegaard interpretation. There is nothing wrong with this, but it makes the book really one about Kierkegaard. By comparison with the authority and confidence with which Kosch treats Kierkegaard, the Kant section is relatively unadventurous and the Schelling section rather selective in its interest. I was therefore left with the feeling of a certain confusion of motive. If the point of the earlier two parts of the book was really to establish a historical matrix for interpreting Kierkegaard, then what is the rationale behind, for instance, devoting a section to Schelling's unpublished 1804 system? Similarly (on a larger scale) the long and very scholarly excursus on the diffusion of Schelling's late ideas in Kierkegaard's direction makes one wonder about the point of devoting so much energy to analyzing Schelling's lectures in their modern forms, to which Kierkegaard could not have been exposed. The historical and analytical impulses of the book do not always work in harmony.

While Kosch's basic thesis is novel, interesting and very well worked out, I did find the Schelling section somewhat disappointing. Kosch's essentially bipartite periodization of Schelling tends to view the Freedom essay and the Ages of the World as merely transitional to the philosophy of revelation. No one doubts that these works are flawed (in three drafts Schelling never managed to get beyond the first age of the world!) but many commentators regard these works as forming a genuine middle period between the naïve optimism of the early works and the fusty pessimism of the late thinking. These commentators, in particular Martin Heidegger, Jürgen Habermas and Slavoj Žižek, are conspicuous by their absence (or near absence) from what is otherwise an incredibly well-researched monograph: Heidegger and Habermas merit a couple of scholarly footnotes each and Žižek isn't mentioned at all. I can see a possible conflict of personalities between the hysterical Žižek and the sober-minded confrontation with idealist thought that Kosch engineers, but all the same Žižek is the single most famous Schelling commentator writing today and surely deserves at least dismissive refutation!

It is interesting to speculate how the book might have developed both in a more political direction and in a direction more critical of Kierkegaard, if Kosch had attended more to the famous predecessors in Schelling interpretation. But that would clearly be to want Kosch to have written a different book. As it is, the actual version marks the emergence of an already strong scholar with the potential to become a major voice in Anglophone understanding of 19th century European thought.