Freedom and Religion in Kant and His Immediate Successors: The Vocation of Humankind, 1774-1800

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George Di Giovanni, Freedom and Religion in Kant and His Immediate Successors: The Vocation of Humankind, 1774-1800, Cambridge University Press, 2005, 388pp, $75.00 (hbk), ISBN 0521844517.

Reviewed by Angelica Nuzzo, Brooklyn College, CUNY


Di Giovanni's book fills an important gap in the Anglo-American literature on the so-called "from Kant to Hegel" period of German philosophy. Given that the author has been working on the texts, figures, and themes of this period for the last twenty years now, helping as no other scholar their diffusion in the English-speaking world, this book can be seen as most successfully crowning two decades of investigations. Di Giovanni brings together in a systematic and unitary narrative moments and figures that scholars interested in this period generally encounter only in a scattered manner. The central problem of the book -- the problem that Dieter Henrich has labeled the problem of classic German philosophy in the transition "from Kant to Hegel" -- is both historical and systematic. The general systematic question regards the relationship between metaphysics and transcendental philosophy (and indeed the qualification of "metaphysics") in Kant's project of a Critique of Reason and in its immediate aftermath. To address this issue, Di Giovanni takes a historical route and proposes to investigate the reception of Kant's Critique of Reason among his contemporaries (Jacobi, Reinhold, Rehberg, and Fichte in particular, but a figure present throughout the book is also Spinoza, the Spinoza made into a contemporary by his eighteenth-century readers). How did Kant's work and the language in which it is articulated sound to contemporary ears in relation to old metaphysics on the one hand and to the popular philosophy of the Enlightenment on the other? How did contemporary philosophers read and react to Kant's proposals and what did they do with Kant's ideas in their own philosophical work? At stake is the transition from the Enlightenment and its internal tensions to the idealism of Fichte and Hegel. On Di Giovanni's account, far from reconciling the contradictory tendencies of Enlightenment philosophy (as Reinhold's presentation and reformation of critical philosophy has it), Kant contributed to explode them and to make them no longer tenable (in particular, the author makes his point with regard to Spalding's idea of "human vocation" and to the tension that Kant introduces between this Enlightenment concept and the idea of faith). In Di Giovanni's reconstruction, the heated debate on Kantian idealism (prompted already by the first Critique in its two editions of 1781 and 1787) ultimately crystallizes around the idea of freedom and its possibility (central here is the third antinomy of the Transcendental Dialectic), the foundation of individuality (who is the subject of Kant's transcendental investigation), the idea of "humanism," and the place of religion in philosophy. As suggested by the full title of the book, the theme of the "vocation of humankind" (an expression first introduced by Spalding, taken seriously and yet profoundly subverted by Kant, and finally assumed as his own 'heroic' formula by Fichte in the tract of 1800) can be viewed as the program of an entire age.

Di Giovanni's immersion in the frame of mind of Kant's contemporaries, however, is meant to yield interpretive results that speak to an audience placed in the twenty-first century (and more particularly in North America); an audience that has been formed by the conflicting Kant interpretations of Strawson and Allison (and their respective followers). As Di Giovanni reveals in the very first pages of the book, his work springs from the intriguing recognition that Kant's contemporaries were all, in a sense, 'Strawsonians'. "So far as Kant's contemporaries were concerned, there was indeed in Kant's critical system something like a transcendental story in Strawson's sense " a story about a metaphysical unknown 'thing in itself', about sensible intuitions of space and time, about the connection between the limits of knowledge and the possibility of human freedom (ix-x). To the list one should add the notion of an intellectual intuition -- for Kant indeed unconceivable yet still adumbrated -- and of freedom's peculiar form of causality. On these ambiguous and even contradictory notions Kant's contemporaries have been unrelentlessly disputing and elaborating. The point is that, on Strawson's account, the transcendental story is clearly in conflict with the most innovative aspects of Kant's critical story (the conceptual a priori of experience). Interestingly, Di Giovanni's book lends plausibility to Strawson's thesis, if not directly with regard to Kant's philosophy, certainly with regard to the readings that his contemporaries offered for it.

Revealing this intriguing connection with our own contemporary philosophical scene, Di Giovanni's historical reconstruction gains a fundamental place in our discussion of Kant's philosophy and, even more broadly, on the issue of the transformation of Western metaphysics with and after Kant. On his account, Kant's transcendental story was back then as it is today the fundamental source of misunderstanding and murky disputes among Kant's interpreters and readers. Ultimately, it is this transcendental story that makes all issues at stake intrinsically intractable and destined to have no positive solution (29). Thus, in the face of this general conclusion, the question arises: What is the alternative to the diagnosed dead end of Kantianism (and Enlightenment philosophy)? On Di Giovanni's account, Fichte is the first to see the fatal implications of Kant's transcendental story and its metaphysical presuppositions. However, while his aim is to liberate Kant's philosophy from its dogmatic, metaphysical residues, Fichte still works within the framework of Kant's moral philosophy and indeed, at least apparently, within the framework of Spalding's optimistic view of the vocation of humankind. If Fichte is not able to provide a satisfactory solution to the dead end of Kantianism (being himself implicated in it), Hegel's philosophy may be taken here as Di Giovanni's answer to our question. Hegel, however, is not a direct protagonist of this book. It is, however, the author's aim to lead us, historically, up to the origin of Hegel's Phenomenology and Logic.

As Di Giovanni notices in the opening of chapter 1, Kant is the main protagonist of the book yet not the only and not even the main object of its interest (1). There is a complex constellation of other figures -- generally considered minor and often not even available in English translation -- that Di Giovanni's work has the merit of bringing to the fore by weaving the complex net of the discussion around Kant's Critique of Reason. On the other hand, however, the interpretation of Kant's texts (and its very selection) is always filtered through the contemporary debate and never occurs in a purely immanent way. Only in one chapter one finds more exhaustive analyses of Kant's theories (chapter 5: "Kant's Moral System") -- all the other chapters always present Kant indirectly through the eyes of contemporary readers. This is a methodological choice to which Di Giovanni adheres consistently throughout the book. It is, however, difficult at times to decide whether or not Di Giovanni endorses the proposed interpretation of Kant, and whether or not the reader may propose an alternative reading of the problem at hand (it is one thing to claim that Kant's principle of moral action was conceived by his contemporaries in terms of Spinoza's causa sui; it is another to claim that Kant's principle of moral action is indeed conceived as Spinoza's causa sui; the reader's reaction to the first claim is not the same as the one to the second).

After having shown how Kant's Copernican revolution overturns the traditional relation between faith and intellect characterizing metaphysics since its medieval times (the formula of the fides quaerens intellectum is transformed by Kant into a sort of intellectus quaerens fidem -- p. 36), chapter 2 offers a precise picture of Enlightenment Popularphilosophie, a topic rarely discussed in the Anglo-American literature. Interestingly, Di Giovanni's assessment of the main characters of German popular philosophy follows contemporary genealogies (such as Reinhold's -- p. 38 ff.) and criticisms (such as Hegel's) and sketches out its reaction to the main tenets of modern philosophy (Leibniz and Locke in particular). Di Giovanni's aim is to show how the popular philosophers missed the novelty of Kant's Critique of Reason because they were simply re-translating it into their own, still Leibnizian conceptual categories (the work of reviewers of the Critique such as Feder, Pistorius, Garve, Eberhard, and Abicht in matters of practical philosophy is analyzed). Ultimately, the author suggests that this way of reading Kant is at least in part responsible for the confusion brought into the debate around Jacobi's 1785 Spinoza-Letters. The other share of responsibility falls back directly on Kant himself, namely, on the ambiguities of his transcendental story (in particular of his idea of freedom still defined as a form of causality -- p. 159 ff.).

Along with Reinhold and Fichte (the latter will appear only later on in the second part of the story), Jacobi is one of the protagonists of the book. While Reinhold aims at a faithful reformation of Kant's philosophy, Jacobi is polemically opposed to it from the outset (see chapter 3, which adds a third figure to the picture, Pastor Schulz with his own popularizing exposition of Kant; and chapter 4). As key to the debate around Kant's philosophy, Di Giovanni rightly chooses the topics of human freedom, the foundation of individuality, and the gap between nature's lawfulness and the order of human intentions. The issue of freedom occupies Di Giovanni in the remainder of the book (chapters 4-6 in particular). In his strenuous opposition to reason and rationality (ambiguously taken by him as both Enlightenment rationality and as the rationality brought forth by the new idealism), Jacobi draws the issue of individuality and faith to the center. The accusation of atheism with which Jacobi stigmatizes idealism pervades the entire controversy on Kant's Critique, finding its culmination point in Fichte's Atheismusstreit.

Di Giovanni's detailed reconstruction shows how the contemporary debate on the possibility of human freedom is characterized by ample confusion and misunderstandings. The source is indicated in Kant's transcendental story and in the contradiction produced by Kant's concept of freedom. "Freedom stood at once for a sort of presumed hyperphysical source of causality and for an ideally determined form of conduct" (29) -- two meanings whose conciliation proved utterly impossible. While Rehberg is the first to criticize the still too metaphysical character of Kant's practical philosophy, Fichte is the first to explicitly seek to liberate Kant's Critique from its dogmatic presuppositions (chapter 6). His project crystallizes in the 1800 Vocation of Humankind, which Di Giovanni analyzes in light of the tensions between Kant's moral philosophy and Spalding's Enlightenment optimism (chapter 8). It is at this point that Di Giovanni hints at Hegel's further development of a problematic that had seemed to have reached a dead end.

The book raises an important methodological question. It regards the relationship between two different strategies of reading Kant -- one aiming at presenting Kant directly 'in his own right'; the other aiming at reading Kant in his contemporary context, through the eyes of his contemporaries, as it were. In following the second strategy in such a thorough and exemplary way, with his conclusion Di Giovanni seems to pull the reader in the opposite direction. If the contemporaries have so massively misunderstood Kant, and yet, paradoxically, they have misunderstood him even perhaps because they understood him best, can their portrait of Kant's philosophy really be useful to us and to what extent? Shouldn't we rather attempt to interpret his Critique of Reason immanently and per se (a question that would certainly need further investigation)? Di Giovanni's interpretive strategy, precisely by its being followed so consistently, has a strange effect on a twentieth-first century reader exposed to such different interpretations of Kant (different, I say, despite the alleged proximity of Popularphilosophen to Strawson). It certainly makes one reflect on a crucial point: what are we looking for in approaching Kant's texts? What are our ideological as well as historical biases and how do we bring them to bear on what we are reading?

Finally, a question kept presenting itself to me in reading this book. What is the role of the Critique of Judgment in this debate? To a certain extent, isn't this the work in which Kant takes the position -- indeed more than in any other part of the critical projects -- with regard to the relation between nature and freedom (and the "unnatural" character of freedom) raised so vehemently by his contemporaries? While Di Giovanni cites passages of the third Critique at the beginning of his study, references to it are rare in the course of the book and are all limited to the same passage. Perhaps a more thorough discussion of the third Critique would have led directly (indeed too directly) to Hegel and to another development of the story? (See the conclusion of chapter 8, 293 ff.). Interestingly, the Critique of Judgment is brought into the picture not with regard to the issue of the construction of the individual subject of transcendental philosophy (which is instead the very topic discussed by Di Giovanni), not with regard to the conciliation of nature and freedom or to the issues of teleology and moral theology, but in relation to ยงยง76-77 and to the hypothesis of the intuitive understanding. This, however, is precisely the issue that attracts the interest of later idealists, by no means a central topic of Kant's last Critique. Di Giovanni's (or Kant's contemporaries') suggestion that in these sections Kant is aiming nolens volens at a sub specie aeterni consideration of the universe is, in my view, disputable (160). It is instead certainly indisputable that Hegel's own philosophical starting point comes out of this train of reflections.