Freedom and Self-Creation: Anselmian Libertarianism

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Katherin A. Rogers, Freedom and Self-Creation: Anselmian Libertarianism, Oxford University Press, 2015, 248pp., $74.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780198743972.

Reviewed by Tomas Ekenberg, Uppsala University


The kind of project that Katherin A. Rogers embarks on in her book has the potential to be invaluable. For those of us who believe neither in simple philosophical progress (be it through progressive accumulation of solutions or through successive paradigm shifts) nor in the presence of unchanging perennial problems, this is a type of work that presents unique opportunities to challenge contemporary philosophical prejudices and recover important insights that we have lost over the course of the centuries. It is also very difficult work, since it requires both a sensitivity to historical context and a keen sense of what is important here and now. The risk of distorting the philosophies of old is always there, as is the risk of alienating our peers by making the objects of our studies seem irrelevant or outright silly.

Rogers wishes to introduce into the free will debate a new (old) position, Anselmian libertarianism. Her aim is to show that this position has affinities with various contemporary libertarian theories, but also that it is a "different and attractive position" (p. 74). According to Rogers, what Anselm of Canterbury (1033-1109) pioneered was a libertarianism based on the insight that moral responsibility is incompatible with some understandings of the Christian doctrine of creation. As she reads Anselm, created agents such as human beings and angels must be capable of at least a limited form of self-creation and this requires creaturely aseity: God cannot be the direct creator of (all) their choices, but (some of) their choices must flow strictly from themselves alone, in latin "a se". Anselm develops this conception of free will as a condition for moral responsibility in his dialogue De casu diaboli, where he argues that if God were simply to give Satan the will which constituted his sin, then God would be responsible for that sin. In order to make Satan a responsible self-creator, God therefore gave Satan two inconsistent "wills" or "affections", thereby producing in Satan a "torn condition" and an opportunity (perhaps even the necessity) for making a choice. In other words, Rogers establishes that Anselm subscribes to the widely shared intuition that moral responsibility, and perhaps free will, requires alternate possibilities or open options. She argues moreover that Anselm's conception of free will is incompatibilist. If the choice of a created being is determined, which means that it is causally necessitated, then that choice is not free and a se. Were God the creator of all of a creature's choices, then all of the creature's choices would be causally necessitated. Rogers' concludes that Anselm belongs to the libertarian camp in the contemporary free will debate.

Having briefly described Anselm's position in the Introduction, Rogers begins Chapter 1 by developing a new version of the controller argument against compatibilism. The argument is designed to challenge compatibilist intuitions about the conditions for free and responsible action by offering a hypothetical case where all the conditions for free action are met, but where the agent's choice is under another agent's control and subject to manipulation. In Rogers' Anselmian version of the argument, the controller is God. If the compatibilist agrees with the intuition that a choice that is made by a creature as the result of divine manipulation is not a free and responsible choice, and with the intuition that natural causes in a deterministic universe operate in much the same way as a divine omnipotent creator-manipulator does, then the compatibilist will be in trouble.

In Chapters 2-4, Rogers discusses Anselm's conception of the will and of "willing" or choosing, and presents some further elements of the Anselmian libertarian position. Anselm's notion of self-creating a se choice is associated with a form of agent causation rather than event causation. According to Rogers, Anselm denies that the choice is a "thing" with ontological status, and this enables him to stick to a parsimonious version of agent causation, one which does not posit any new sort of causality beyond the one implied by God's creative action and whatever effects result from that action. Further, she argues that even if not all choices are a se choices, and some of our choices are determined by our own character, we can be held accountable for character-determined choices, if the status of our character can be traced back to earlier a se choices. This is a version of the so-called Tracing View.

Rogers then turns to discussing compatibilist challenges in chapters 5 and 6, dealing first with Alfred Mele's critique of theories that make free will or truly autonomous agency depend entirely on internal or structural psychological conditions (more on this below). She then discusses Harry Frankfurt's famous critique of the principle of alternate possibilities. Neither succeeds in defeating Anselmian libertarian intuitions.

Chapters 7 and 8 are both devoted to the Luck Problem. Here Rogers argues that if the Anselmian libertarian is right about free choice, then not only can we never predict future choices, but it is useless to even try and assess the probability of a certain outcome. Each a se choice is a perfectly unique (non-)event. But Rogers wants us to resist the impression that the outcome should be a matter of luck. Instead, both the Anselmian and Anselm himself thinks that the theory entails an element of "mystery" (p. 208). Rogers considers the Luck Problem to be, in the end, a battle of intuitions.

The last chapter discusses a problem with the Tracing View especially in relation to the Anselmian libertarian suggestion that the choice is not a proper thing. If the a se choice of a self-creating agent is an event with weak ontological status and constitutes so slight a happening as to even perhaps pass unnoticed by the agent him- or herself, then can we still hold the agent responsible for the resulting fixation of character and the future character-determined choices deemed responsible per the Tracing View? Rogers argues we can, because it is enough that the agent is cognizant of the particular content of the choice, and this in turn is guaranteed by the fact that the agent is fully aware of the object of the two or more affections between which he or she is first being torn.

I fear that Anselm scholars and free will enthusiasts will find Rogers' discussion unsatisfactory for reasons which, although various, ultimately converge on one and the same point. In developing the Anselmian libertarian position Rogers constantly mentions Anselm and his works, but since she only very rarely and only very casually engages with Anselm's actual texts, the details of her Anselm reading, and therefore Anselm's own views, are never made clear enough to admit fully of either exegetical or philosophical evaluation. As a consequence, the reader is in the end left uncertain as to what exactly is distinctively Anselmian about this libertarianism and also what marks Anselmian libertarianism off as a distinctive brand of libertarianism. We learn that Anselm believes that human beings are capable of a limited form of self-creation through the "aseity" of (some of) their choices, and that this in turn requires that they be situated in "the torn condition", in which they find themselves torn between two (or more) incompossible options. The power for self-creation is, moreover, for Rogers' Anselm the fundamental condition not only for moral responsibility, but also for the very special dignity we may feel that human beings have. The exotic terminology aside, to what extent can the talk of aseity and self-creation be turned into a detailed argument to the effect that the determinism entailed by the notion of universal scientific laws clashes with our cherished presuppositions about moral responsibility?

At some points Rogers distorts Anselm's points, as when she claims Anselm invents a new word, pervelle, to describe the (non-)event where an agent chooses one of two affections by just sticking with (or holding on to) one affection while letting the other go. Anselm indeed invents such a word, but his point is clearly not related to the mechanics of choice. What he wishes to describe is what an angel is doing when he perseveres in justice up until the very end. The very end of days, that is, or eternally. The contrast is with Satan, who did not thus "per-will".

Anselm's discussions do not map perfectly onto those of some of our peers today. While free will is nowadays nearly always approached as a problem, Anselm belongs to a tradition where free will is first and foremost a solution. It is a problematic solution, to be sure, but the supposition of creaturely free will is a given, not a point to be debated. Creaturely liberum arbitrium helps explain how, in a universe created by a benevolent omnipotent God, there can exist evil. The solution immediately turns into a problem once we ask about the value of free will itself. Why do we get liberum arbitrium when it seems we would have done better without it? God must have had good reasons for giving free will to creatures. Notice we are not asking whether human beings have free will. The primal sins of the rebel angels and of the first human beings are taken as facts, and so is the existence of the free wills by which they were committed. The question is why we have this special power, and what it means to have it.

By contrast, Rogers' Anselm insists on free will in response to a quite different worry, namely that if God causes everything, then God alone should be held responsible for all. This of course enables her to bring Anselm closer to the issues driving the contemporary debate, but the question is what are the exact consequences of such a restructuring of Anselm's own problematic. While I believe such a translation of the problems is unavoidable, I submit that each element of this reconstruction needs to be carefully evaluated step by step if we are to avoid distortions and other pitfalls.

The fact that Rogers deals with a modified Anselm in this way helps explain why she insists that Anselm's view is founded on a basic intuition rather than argument and analysis (p. 4 and 41). And this in turn may help explain why, as I see it, she misses an excellent opportunity in chapter 5 to clarify her own Anselm reading, while staying in close contact with the contemporary debate and simultaneously providing some arguments in favour of Anselmian libertarianism as she construes it. Mele put forward an interesting example in Free Will and Luck (OUP 2006, p. 52), which Rogers presents and discusses, only to reject it as irrelevant. Mele's example is strikingly similar to Anselm's story in De casu diaboli 12-14, where an angel is created step-by-step and is given one will to justice and one will to benefit. Rogers alludes to Anselm's passage in this context but does not elaborate.

Mele's example is designed to challenge the intuition that an indeterministic choice between options is sufficient for free will, which of course is an intuition that Rogers appeals to throughout (see e.g., p. 127). In Mele's example an agent, Antti, finds himself in the position of having two options and  trying ("willing") to do each. He indeterministically ends up opting for one of them and afterwards endorses his choice. It is, however, the case that both options and both tryings are the direct result of prior manipulation of Antti by some external manipulator, and both options are things Antti would abhor doing if he weren't subject to manipulation. Mele goes on to argue that the sort of self-control exhibited by the person who chooses "freely" between alien options is not sufficient for autonomous agency. He concludes that we need more than the sort of control exhibited by an agent within whose power it is to select between two (or more) options, regardless of how those options came to be.

In Anselm's thought experiment, the two options and the two tryings, i.e., the two objects of the will and the actual willing of these objects, are given by God. And so the tryings are the direct result of manipulation. Consequently, the "torn condition" Rogers talks about is the direct result of manipulation. Now, on Rogers' reading, the angel alone chooses which "trying" to go through with and precisely in virtue of this the angel is free and responsible (indeed, a creator of himself to some extent). But what if God had given him one will to read Nietzsche and one will to eat gravel? Add the reasonable supposition that he finds the two activities difficult to pursue simultaneously and finds himself torn between the two. Does the fact that he has it within himself to turn himself, for the time being, into a full-time Nietzsche reader or a full-time gravel eater make us likely to consider him fully free and responsible for his actions? And if not, have we not agreed with Mele that while the power over alternative possibilities is, at best, a necessary condition for freedom or creaturely aseity?

Reading Rogers' book one may get the impression that all work done on Anselm over the last couple of decades was done by Rogers herself. In her list of references not a single scholarly work on Anselm is listed apart from her own. I wish to stress that Anselm's thought -- especially in the area of ethics and free will -- has been the subject of quite a bit of interesting philosophical debate lately, lest anyone believe that her list of cited works give any clue as to the state of the art. (Sandra Visser's and Thomas Williams's works immediately come to mind, as does Sigbjørn Sønnesyn's, Eileen Sweeney's and Bernd Goebel's, to name just a handful.)

While the book fails to live up to its promise to deliver a clear exposition of an Anselmian approach to the contemporary free will problem, Anselm scholars who are familiar with Rogers' earlier work will find in this one helpful clues as to Rogers's own basic interpretative principles and presuppositions. This will very likely help structure the ongoing discussion and promote future progress towards the goal of deepening our understanding of the medieval debate on free will and its importance in relation to contemporary issues in metaphysics.

The book features a beautiful cover illustration by Moro Rogers.