Freedom Beyond Sovereignty: Reconstructing Liberal Individualism

Placeholder book cover

Sharon R. Krause, Freedom Beyond Sovereignty: Reconstructing Liberal Individualism, University of Chicago Press, 2015, 249pp., $30.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780226234694.

Reviewed by Carmen E. Pavel, King's College London


A recent BBC article documents a growing tendency among young Egyptian women who move away from their parents and live independently, bucking a trend in conservative Islamic societies where girls rarely leave their parents' home before marriage. This trend is something to be celebrated, for unlike men, women in many parts of the world have a long way to go towards being treated as free and responsible individuals. One learns in the same breath that the young Egyptian women are prevented from truly relishing their independence. Complete strangers self-appoint as guardians of the girls' honor. One woman reported that landlords "treated us like their private property or children who could be controlled and had to obey them. For instance, they want details about where we go, who we are meeting, what time we plan on coming home and who visits the apartment - even if the visitors are female."[1] Such intrusiveness is indicative of wider social and cultural norms that make the efforts of young women to assume responsibility for their own destiny a tragic, uphill battle.

This experience of frustrated freedom is captured beautifully by Sharon R. Krause's new book. Krause articulates a simple yet so far elusive truth: that the freedom of a person depends in large part on how other people interpret and respond to her actions. A young black lawyer who drives a sleek new car sees it as a tangible symbol of his achievement, work ethic, and intelligence. Yet against the background of widespread racial profiling, the cop in the street imagines he has obtained possession of the vehicle illegally, pulls him over and questions him suspiciously, and in the process denies his effective self-expression. The meaning of his actions is interpreted through the lens of stigma and racial stereotype. Gender stereotypes manifest themselves similarly. Women in professional settings face dispiriting and often confusing experiences of conveying their opinion in a straightforward manner and being instead perceived as antagonistic because their behavior does not conform to the norms of female deference that still persist in the work environments of the most advanced democracies.

What unites these experiences of frustrated freedom? It is certainly not the fact that the protagonists in these examples lack the capacity for rational, intentional control over their actions or face legal impediments to their choices. Krause thus parts ways with a long tradition in western political thought dating back to Locke, Kant and Mill, which locates individual freedom in the rational will and the capacity to exercise intentional choice and control. In fact, the originality of Krause's account is showing how freedom can be undermined despite a generally friendly background of political rights and privileges that guarantee the space for intentional choice. Something subtler is going on, which is why certain dimensions of freedom have been absent from standard accounts of what it means to be free. The quality of our everyday interpersonal exchanges matters quite a lot for individual freedom because these interactions are constitutive of personal agency.

Krause argues that a proper understanding of agency is inextricably tied to freedom. Following Bernard Williams, she deploys a two-dimensional conception of agency: agency consists both in deliberation and results. To be an agent is both to plan one's actions and to have a recognizable impact on the world. Agency is thus "the affirmation of one's subjective existence, or personal identity, through concrete action in the world." The efficacy dimension of agency distinguishes it from "mere willing or dreaming." (4) Crucially, however, we are not in complete control of how our actions affect the world. Their effect depends, in significant part, on how others perceive and respond to them. Rosa Parks was not the first person to refuse to go to the back of the bus. The tremendous impact of her action was owed to the coordinated responses of countless participants in the civil rights movement, who chose her action as a rallying call for a rights revolution. They articulated its public significance in a way that led to changes in the legal standing of millions of blacks. Parks's impact on the world depended on the social uptake of large numbers of people.

Many of our actions do, every day. Yet this simple truth is easy to miss for those in a position of privilege. This feature of agency goes unseen because the privileged have the benefit of cultural and social norms which sustain their agency and guarantee the effective realization of their actions. This is why traditional accounts of agency have had so much trouble accommodating the fact that freedom depends on how others interpret and respond to our actions.

The effects of our agency are not always intentional. We both change the world in ways we did not intend and interpret the actions of others in ways that change their intended impact. Employers who do not set out to discriminate can yet fall prey to unconscious biases that make them choose men over women, natives over foreigners, or whites over black job candidates. Unconscious biases undermine employers' professed nondiscriminatory aims ('maybe she is not as reliable as the other job candidate', 'maybe his culture prevents him from fitting in'), but so do their bodies, gestures, posture, tone of voice, and the way they make eye contact. Bodies have communicative power in social interactions and reflect conscious and less conscious dispositions towards diverse gender, racial, sexual, and political groups.

As Krause puts it, bigotry, racism, and social stigma "prevent the social interpretation of an act from affirming the agent's understanding of it," which is why agency is vulnerable to differential social standing among groups. (38) This insight does not imply that agency is in any simple way socially determined. Individuals play a key role in giving meaning to their actions and choosing their context. Nonetheless, the effect they have on the world depends on the contingencies of other people's interpretation and response.

At no point does Krause abandon the normative individualism at the core of the liberal project as it evolved historically. Hers is a liberal agenda through and through, replete with concern for the ultimate moral value of individual human beings and for the effective expression of their freedom, which requires a large, legally protected space within which they can make their choices. Consequently, her account valorizes the classical panoply of political guarantees for individual freedom, such as strong civil and political rights, the rule of law, a constitutionally limited government that unleashes rather than suffocates individual agency, and robust cultural norms of toleration and respect for difference that lie at the heart of any healthy modern liberal democracy. What is distinctive about Krause's approach is her insistence that for true freedom to flourish, these guarantees are not enough. We need in addition an awareness of how impersonal dynamics, cultural values, and social practices sustain or deny the expression of individual freedom.

Krause conceives freedom in contrast to the familiar understanding of freedom as personal sovereignty or rational control over one's actions. Yet far from denying the value of earlier conceptions of freedom that the book criticizes, she seeks to expand traditional notions of sovereign freedom and make them resonant with the frequent experiences of the marginalized and excluded. For example, her non-sovereign freedom does not abandon freedom as non-interference and non-domination, two of the more popular accounts of sovereign freedom, and argues that they signify historically important steps toward making freedom effective. The limit of such conceptions, however, is that they do not go far enough. They fail to realize the non-sovereign dimensions of freedom, which elude individual control, and depend on social uptake.

Isaiah Berlin's view provides one of the main points of contrast.[2] One is free, on Berlin's account, as long as one enjoys a protected sphere so that other individuals cannot interfere with one's opportunities to act. Berlin's account is subject to well-known complications, but critics and foes alike agree that he defends an opportunity conception of freedom as opposed to an exercise conception.[3] Thus, the individual on Berlin's account need not act in order to be considered free, she merely needs to enjoy the space within which to make choices free from coercion. According to Krause, the 'opportunity view' is both a strength and a weakness of Berlin's account. It is a strength because we all require a protected sphere free from the interference of the state and other individuals in other to be able to plan and execute our choices. But Berlin misses the special importance of the effective exercise of agency for freedom. Freedom cannot be measured by formal barriers alone. Social recognition and interpretation of one's actions that is consonant with one's own interpretation is also important, and these are factors that help make agency effective and freedom unencumbered. The business owner whose body language sends signals to employees of different racial or ethnic origin that they are not valued does not interfere with their freedom in ways that Berlin would recognize, yet such signals render them less free.

Similar difficulties plague Philip Pettit's non-domination view.[4] In its simplest version, domination is captured by the master-slave dynamic. What is distinctive about Pettit's approach compared to Berlin's is not only that the master actually interferes with the choices of its slave, but also that it has the capacity to interfere even when such capacity is not exercised. Less intense forms of domination co-exist comfortably with liberal democratic background norms. Women who are at the beck and call of their husbands, workers vulnerable to the petty harassment of their superiors, or citizens subject to the abuses committed by government officials are all forms of domination that Pettit wants to draw attention to. Where Pettit errs, according to Krause, is when he misses distinctive forms of oppression that do not come from specific, identifiable agents. Gay people are often subject to systematic forms of exclusion, marginalization, ridicule, and violence. These forms of oppression are neither fully intended nor attributable to specific 'masters' and thus fail to fit the domination/slavery paradigm.

Krause's account of freedom, called non-sovereign freedom, incorporates but goes beyond these traditional accounts. "To call human agency non-sovereign," Krause says, "is to say that the exercise of agency regularly comes apart from intentional choice and consistently eludes individual control." (21) This means that intersubjective exchanges make other people integral to the agency of the individual. Freedom as non-oppression must be part of this new conception of agency, as must freedom as collective world-making. Freedom as non-oppression involves expressing one's agency free from the effects of social stigma and marginalization. Freedom as collective world-making involves acting with others towards achieving common social and political goals that have the potential to be both politically and personally transformative. Freedom understood in this way recovers the classical tradition of thinking of freedom in terms of collective self-determination, and it is especially useful for understanding movements for women's rights, civil rights or gay rights.

Non-sovereign freedom is a more demanding ideal than non-interference and non-domination. First, freedom as non-oppression makes demands on our conception of ourselves. Effective agency requires self-awareness and self-respect. These intra-personal qualities protect the individual against the inner damage done by hostile social norms, such as internalized stigma, double consciousness, and adaptive preferences.

Second, non-sovereign freedom is a political ideal of freedom that must guide our interpersonal interactions. Calling non-sovereign freedom a political value does not necessarily entail making the state responsible for promoting it. The subtle social dynamics of social inequality frequently fly under the radar and involve behavior that is not legally actionable. They take place in contexts "where the strong arm and blunt instruments of the state have no place" (185-186) Instead, we must develop an ethos of freedom that covers all of our interactions, including the most intimate ones. Such an ethos is part and parcel of a new ethic of citizenship, which calls us to respond appropriately to others' choices and participate in uprooting cultural values and practices that stigmatize.

Third, and most striking, personal responsibility acquires a new shape. Traditional accounts of responsibility that emphasize intentional choice and rational control over one's action are at once too demanding and not demanding enough. They are too demanding insofar as they see individuals wholly in control of the outcomes of their actions and assign full culpability for their effects. They are not demanding enough because they let individuals off the hook for behaviors that collectively contribute to patterns of social stigma and discriminatory social norms. A new account of personal responsibility will hold individuals accountable for the roles they play in generating and sustaining patterns of oppression. And it will require even citizens who have not been complicit in injustice, such as new immigrants, to become responsive to oppression and take responsibility for correcting it.

Non-sovereign freedom is not meant to replace freedom as non-interference or non-domination. It is rather an inclusive account of freedom that calls for all four conceptions of freedom (non-interference, non-domination, collective world-making, and non-oppression) to receive political recognition and social support. This pluralist account of freedom acknowledges the many dimensions of freedom and the various ways in which freedom can be frustrated. Krause thus challenges the long-standing assumption that freedom can be defined as just one type of frustrated agency or one kind of relation of control and subordination. She insists rightly that freedom is multifaceted, and any conception of freedom must contain a proper recognition of its variegated nature.

Different freedoms can come into conflict, and when they do, we face uneasy trade-offs. Consider the controversies surrounding the veiling of Muslim women. Krause argues that veils are sometimes "the physical embodiment of women's instrumentalization" and therefore can represent instances of oppression that should be resisted. (174) Krause is aware that such judgments are complicated by the fact that women themselves often affirm the wearing of the veil. This in itself is an exercise of freedom as non-interference. She believes that we can allow them the choice to wear the veil while criticizing injustices in the background conditions that give rise to the practice.

It is worth emphasizing how treacherous it can be to read patterns of oppression from women's dress choices, and I do not know whether Krause invites us to do so. Veils are multivalent. They can symbolize religious piety, female modesty, respect for tradition, the need to fit in and be recognized by other women, and can be freely chosen for these reasons. Of course, in oppressive social contexts it is hard to distinguish free choice from adaptive preference or even outright coercion. Still, the fact that women living in liberal democracies make the choice to wear the veil tells us that in contexts that are much less problematic, wearing the veil can be, and often is, a free choice. Far from failing to take women seriously as agents, allowing the wearing of the veil acknowledges that outsiders cannot really place themselves into the deeply personal and appropriately opaque process of identity creation. This is why outright bans such as the one in France are often heavy handed attempts at defending freedom while actually undermining it.

I would argue that we need to focus less on correcting the outward expressions of personal identity, however fraught with problematic choices they might be, and more on the removal of stigmas and social biases and cultural norms that lead to individuals not making the choices that authentically represent them. This is in line with Krause's view, for the expression of personal identity through effective action is central to freedom as non-oppression. Giving women wide berth to make choices about their appearance is compatible with working simultaneously to change cultural norms that impose restrictive dress codes, according to which differential treatment of women is justified by reference to whether they choose to wear the veil or not.

In addition, there is an important ambiguity inherent in the complex relationship between agency and freedom. Krause offers enlightening examples of how certain types of responses frustrate individual freedom, but more work is needed to settle the contours of responding appropriately to others' actions. Take a little known artist for example. Does the fact that her art is not valued widely -- that few people offer to buy her paintings or visit her exhibits -- constitute a denial of her freedom? What distinguishes this case from racial stigmatization? Krause's argument opens up avenues for elaborating further on how people's freedom to react to each other can be fundamentally at odds with freedom as non-oppression.

The chief ambition of this book is to uncover the ways in which social stigma and subtle patterns of social interaction can perpetuate unfreedom, and as such it is a welcome challenge to our settled convictions about what it means to live in a free society. The style is accessible, personal, and truly generous towards views Krause disagrees with. "I make common cause with many different views but follow no one," Krause says, giving expression to the ecumenical undercurrent of her book, which makes a groundbreaking contribution to a centuries-long debate over the nature of freedom.


This review was written with the support of a grant from the John Templeton Foundation. The opinions expressed in it are those of the author and do not necessarily reflect the views of the John Templeton Foundation.

[1] Ali Gamal, "Egypt: The Lure for Girls of Living Alone," BBC News, July 21, 2015.

[2] Isaiah Berlin, Liberty: Incorporating Four Essays on Liberty, 2nd edition (Oxford University Press, 2002), 166-217.

[3] Charles Taylor, "What's Wrong with Negative Liberty?," in The Idea of Freedom: Essays in Honour of Isaiah Berlin, ed. Alan Ryan (Oxford University Press, 1979).

[4] Philip Pettit, Republicanism: A Theory of Freedom and Government (Oxford University Press, 1999), 51-79.