Freedom from Past Injustices: A Critical Evaluation of Claims for Inter-Generational Reparations

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Nahshon Perez, Freedom from Past Injustices: A Critical Evaluation of Claims for Inter-Generational Reparations, Edinburgh University Press, 2012, 186pp. $104 (hbk), ISBN 9780748649624.

Reviewed by Alexa Zellentin, Universität Graz


Nahshon Perez asks whether contemporary citizens should be burdened by requests of material redress for the rectification of past wrongs. He challenges the arguments of those who support intergenerational compensation and argues that individuals born after a wrong has ended have a right to a clean slate. While he mentions the usual problems of evaluating how much anyone owes any successors of historical injustice and how claims might get weaker through time, his main objection to the idea is principled rather than practical. His key concern is that it is incompatible with the separateness of persons to impose costs on someone who was not responsible for voluntarily and wrongfully causing a problem. In his view, therefore, compensation cannot be justified in the intergenerational context given that no member of a current generation can be in the relevant sense responsible for the historic injustice. Rather, according to Perez only particular cases of restitution following undisputed cases of unjust enrichment can be justified since this is not about imposing costs but rather about redistributing undeserved benefits. Perez's book thus offers a critical discussion of the popular claim that current generations 'ought to do something' about injustices committed by their forbearers. The particular strength of his analysis is that he carefully lays out all the different relevant concerns from the point of view of those asked to provide compensation.

However, the case he makes is more limited than he leads the reader to believe. His view, furthermore, can be criticised, first, for his oversimplified interpretation of the non-identity problem and, second and more importantly, for his overly restrictive understanding of corrective justice and responsibility.

While Perez stresses how unique his position of opposing intergenerational compensation is within the current debate and aims to disprove much of the relevant literature, his objection to the idea of intergenerational compensation is rather limited. In Chapter 1 Perez introduces his working definitions and the particular focus of the book: material redress for injustices committed by wrongdoers who are no longer alive and suffered by victims who also are no longer around. In focusing on material redress alone, Perez leaves aside all arguments for affirmative action for previously disadvantaged groups, for acknowledging past injustice and suffering, as well as for symbolic gestures aimed at re-establishing an equal standing. While it is perfectly legitimate to limit philosophical analysis to one particular case, Perez restricts his case to that which is most rarely demanded in contexts where people argue in favour of historical redress.

His case is limited in a second respect. Perez starts from the generally acknowledged claim that justifying intergenerational compensation requires showing that there is a morally significant reason a) why the obligation of the original wrongdoer should pass on to his successor, and b) why the entitlement of the original victim can be passed on to his successor. He then challenges different accounts trying to establish such reasons. However, as I will suggest below, his simplified views of the non-identity problem and corrective justice diminish the force of his counterarguments, thus ruling out some, but not all, reasons.

Perez's main opposition to the claim that entitlements of the original victims can be inherited by their descendants is based on the non-identity problem. He argues that if the past injustice was sufficiently significant to even consider seeking redress from future generations, then it would have had such an impact on the victims that it changed their life in profound ways. Given such a deep-reaching life event, any children that are conceived after the occurrence of the past wrong would be different children (conceived at a different time and possibly with a different partner). For any such child, had the historical injustice not happened, it would not have been born at all and therefore such a child cannot be said to stand in a normatively significant relation to the original wrong:

if living is (usually) better than non-living, and if a given historical injustice is causally connected to the existence of the descendants of deceased victims of this historical injustice, how can a living person be wronged by something without which he or she would not exist? (24)

While the non-identity problem -- as developed by Parfit -- raises important questions regarding the plausibility of person-affecting ethics and the adequate understanding of harm and wrong in hypothetical comparisons, it is not a sufficient reason to disregard claims that injustices perpetrated on one's forbearers may not lead to wrongs that continue to affect later generations in a morally significant manner. Just consider a variation of the case that Perez gives as an example of under which circumstances material redress is justified. He chooses the Altmann case for showing when compensation is justified, as it displays the following features. (1) The relevant heir of claims to compensation, Maria Altmann, is not subject to the non-identity problem since she was born in 1916 and thus before the Holocaust. (2) The information regarding the wrong is clear: there is no doubt that Ferdinand and Adele Bloch-Bauer's Gustav Klimt paintings as well as their Swiss bank accounts were wrongfully seized during the Nazi era. (3) The assets requested are well identified since not only ownership of the paintings and the contents of the accounts were well documented, but there also there was a clear will of Ferdinand to leave his belonging to Maria (and very good reasons to assume that Adele would have changed her will to fit Ferdinand's had she known how terribly the state to whom she had intended to bequeath the paintings wronged her family). (4) No changes to the assets or changes in circumstances have eroded the claimant's request since neither art nor money are the kind of good which is susceptible to the supersession thesis, as neither is fundamentally necessary for the well-being of the current unlawful owners. Finally, (5) the new owner cannot persuasively demonstrate a case for legitimate ownership since both the bank and the art gallery holding the paintings were aware that the "transfer" of ownership had been more than problematic. According to Perez, Maria Altmann in this case had a moral as well as legal claim to the inheritance she finally received in 2011.

Now imagine a different scenario: imagine Maria had a younger sister Martha born in 1943 and Ferdinand, when dying in 1945, had written a will that included both sisters. According to Perez, only Maria would be entitled to the material redress since Martha's conception and birth was very likely affected by the way the Holocaust changed her parent's family circumstances. To differentiate between the two sisters in this way in this situation -- where there is a clearly identifiable wrong, clearly identifiable goods, as well as a clear will -- merely on the basis of the circumstances of their conception seems unjustified, even if it is true that Martha would have been a different person had the Holocaust not happened. While this example is not a knock down objection, it raises serious doubts whether the non-identity objection really severs the links between past victims and their descendents in such a strong way as Perez assumes.

It is clear, furthermore, that his discussion of two attempts to overcome the non-identity problem does not engage with the most promising arguments in this respect (which take seriously Parfit's concerns about person-affecting conceptions of harm and wrong and try to find alternative understandings not vulnerable to the counterintuitive conclusions).[1] Rather, the 'timing' and 'identity' arguments he dismisses cite little literature and can be seen as mere straw man arguments.

Perez's objection against the idea that later generations inherit obligations from earlier generations relies mainly on the intuition that it is wrong to impose costs on someone who is not responsible for voluntarily and wrongfully harming someone else. In the structure of his book, Perez does not clearly distinguish between the arguments aiming to establish -- or in his case disprove -- morally significant reasons why obligations should shift from forbearers to later generations, and reasons why entitlements shift from original victims to their descendants. Rather, Perez distinguishes between an individualistic and a collectivist perspective against redress. This means that while he discusses the relevant arguments for why duties of rectification can pass on from those who originally committed an injustice to their heirs, he discusses them from a particular perspective that might not always be best suited to identify the particular strengths and weaknesses of the different accounts. In particular, Perez's discussion of the 'identification argument,' the 'participation argument,' and the 'benefitting argument' does not seem to engage with the arguments as trying to establish reasons why later generations should be in some sense liable for problems caused by earlier generations, but rather considers their value only in providing -- or in his view failing to provide -- 'collective responsibility generators.' In Perez's understanding,

The challenge for a 'collective responsibility creator' is to indicate how collective responsibility arises independently of individual responsibility, or, at the very least, as a special concern when individual responsibility is more difficult to justify. (62-63)

Given his strict understanding of individual responsibility, which -- following H. L. A. Hart and Bernard Williams -- requires voluntariness, causation, and wrongfulness, the bar for such collective responsibility generators is set very high. Perez does not clearly distinguish between what R. A. Duff among others calls 'retrospective responsibility,' i.e. the responsibility for having brought about a particular problem, and what David Miller calls 'remedial responsibility,' that is, obligations to do something about a particular problem.[2] Rather, Perez's preferred understanding of responsibility -- which displays all requirements for moral responsibility, including blameworthiness -- seems to automatically generate liability. While the kind of responsibility he focuses on does indeed trigger duties of corrective justice, it is not the only one to do so.

As Jules Coleman among others points out, there can be cases where an agent is morally obliged to compensate for harm to others that he caused involuntarily and for which he cannot be blamed.[3] Coleman argues that there is an important difference between corrective justice and punitive justice: in the case of punitive justice we are imposing an extra burden on someone who deserves it; in cases of corrective justice we are trying to decide who is to bear an existing burden. At least in some cases there are good reasons to shift the existing burden from the blameless victim to the blameless agent responsible for bringing about the problem or -- as Miller and Daniel Butt among others show -- to the blameless agent benefitting from the problem.[4]

The intuitions concerning the strict criteria for responsibility by Williams and Hart on which Perez relies stem from the sphere of punitive justice rather than corrective justice. For the context of corrective justice being the relevant agent responsible for a particular problem might require less as Tony Honoré and Miller, for example, show in their discussions of outcome responsibility.[5] As Miller shows, what is required for establishing remedial responsibility is a normatively significant link between the agent in question and the problem. If the 'identification argument,' the 'participation argument,' and the 'benefitting argument' are understood as aiming to provide a substitute for the moral force of responsibility based on voluntariness, causation, and wrongfulness, they fail -- as Perez rightly shows. However, if these arguments merely aim to establish a morally significant relationship between the agent in question and the problem that explains why this agent in particular has duties to do something to relieve those undeservedly suffering from this problem, it is less clear that Perez can show that they obviously fail the test of respecting the separateness of persons.

An example can show us, furthermore, that requiring the strict conditions of Williams's and Hart's understanding of responsibility in the context of international relations has counterintuitive consequences. Perez argues that citizens qua citizens cannot be held liable for injustices former citizens and their governments committed. They are not morally responsible for the problem, and neither their emotional links to their nation, nor their participation in current state institutions, nor any benefits they have in virtue of belonging to this particular community, or even in virtue of this community's past unjust action, can establish reasons that override the idea that one must not be punished for acts that someone else committed. One objection here relies on Coleman's claim mentioned above that compensatory justice is different from punitive justice. However, if one beliefs that the descendants of victims of historic injustice cannot really be harmed by the wrong perpetrated against their forbearers due to the non-identity problem, then imposing costs of compensation might seem like punishment rather than a shifting of burdens. A second reason to doubt the appropriateness of the chosen understanding of responsibility is that taking Perez's stance seriously would undermine the idea of any intergenerational -- and thus any long term -- planning and contracts. If it is as easy for current citizens and their governments to distance themselves from the past deeds and commitments of their states, as Perez assumes, then we require a radically different understanding of obligations in international relations. Maybe this is a bullet Perez would be willing to bite, but even if it is, he needs to provide more justification as to why his chosen understanding of responsibility is the only appropriate one for the context of compensation for past injustices.


Butt, Daniel, 2009. Rectifying International Injustice Oxford: Oxford University Press.

Coleman, Jules L., 1992. Risks and Wrongs Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.

Duff, R Antony, 1998. Responsibility. In Craig, Edward ed. Routledge Encyclopedia of Philosophy Vol. 8. London: Routledge, 289-294.

Honoré, Tony, 1999. Responsibility and Fault Oxford/Portland, OR: Hart Publishing.

Kumar, Rahul and Silver, David, 2004. The Legacy of Injustice. Wronging the Future, Responsibility for the Past. In Meyer, Lukas H. ed. Justice in Time: Responding to Historical Injustice. Baden-Baden: Nomos Verlagsgesellschaft, 145-158.

Meyer, Lukas H., 2003. Past and Future: the Case for a Threshold Notion of Harm. In Meyer, Lukas H., Paulson, Stanley L. & Pogge, Thomas eds. Rights, Culture, and the Law: Themes from the Legal and Political Philosophy of Joseph Raz. Oxford: Oxford University Press, 143-160.

Miller, David, 2007. National Responsibility and Global Justice New York: Oxford University Press, USA.

[1] He does not mention, for example, either Kumar’s approach on distinguishing between harming and wronging (Kumar and Silver, 2004) nor Meyer’s threshold conception of harm (Meyer, 2003).

[2] See Duff (1998) and Miller (2007, chapter 4).

[3] See Coleman (1992).

[4] See Butt (2009) and Miller (2007).

[5] See Honoré (1999) and Miller (2007).