Freedom, God and Worlds

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Michael J. Almeida, Freedom, God and Worlds, Oxford University Press, 2012, 208pp., $60.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199640027.

Reviewed by Peter Forrest, University of New England


Michael Almeida offers us a detailed defense of moderate Anselmian theism from all versions of the argument from evil.

In chapter one, Almeida explains that moderate Anselmian theism is the thesis that God is of metaphysical necessity an unsurpassable being, that is, the greatest metaphysically possible being. This differs from the thesis that God is the greatest conceivable being, a position Almeida rejects. Now, it is not easy to characterize conceivability, and Almeida opts for taking something to be conceivable if its negation cannot be derived from a priori truths using a priori truth-preserving inferences. Presumably a priori truths are truths knowable a priori in a strong sense of 'know'. Worries that this characterization of conceivability is too strict need not concern us, however, since if metaphysical possibility is less extensive than conceivability-as-characterized-by-Almeida, it is a fortiori less extensive than genuine conceivability.

Anselmian theism implies not only that God has various great-making attributes including goodness, omnipotence, and omniscience but also that these are essential attributes. It further implies that God cannot cease to exist so these essential attributes hold of metaphysical necessity.

Almeida's discussions of versions of the argument from evil are full of careful analyses of quite intricate issues, such as Alvin Plantinga's thesis of transworld depravity (the supposed metaphysical possibility of every individual essence freely choosing to do wrong on every occasion) and of some variants. In addition Almeida replies in detail to various objections. Because of this wealth of material, it would be easy to get lost if he hadn't summarized his conclusions at the end of most chapters, and provided an overall summation in the last chapter. I think the best way to give potential readers an idea of what the book contains is to list five main conclusions (my numbering), all to be found in the last chapter.

  1. Contrary to Plantinga's thesis of the possibility of universal transworld depravity, Almeida argues, in chapter four, that God can bring it about that many morally right and no morally wrong actions are performed, without causing them to be performed, and hence without interfering with creaturely freedom. God can do so by predicting that this happy state of affairs occurs.
  2. Nonetheless, 'it is no more than philosophical dogma that . . .[the Anselmian God] can actualize the best possible world only if he does . . .. Similarly it is no more than philosophical dogma that . . . [the Anselmian God] can actualize a morally perfect world or a good enough world only if he does . . . it. ' (p.230, my italics)
  3. 'It is . . . philosophical dogma that that there is no world in which God exists and unjustified horrendous evil exists'. (p.235)
  4. It is false that, necessarily, God actualizes 'an evolutionarily perfect world' (that is, a world in which evolution operates much as on Earth but without the vast amount of animal suffering that has actually occurred.)
  5. In 'bad worlds', such as ours, God foresees, but does not intend 'that many will bring about evil states of affairs and that many will suffer terribly. But in (at least) some bad worlds God responds to existing evil and suffering redemptively.' (p.239)

(1), to which I shall return later, is clearly an astounding conclusion, but the others might seem innocuous except that God is assumed good of metaphysical necessity. Hence anything God can do is compatible with God's goodness. As a consequence, these conclusions would defeat all versions of the argument from evil, including not only the evidential argument of William Rowe and the Darwinian argument from evil but even the argument from horrendous evils, as formulated by Marilyn McCord Adams. Also defeated is Rowe's argument that God is not free but must create the best.

I consider Almeida to be 'outsmarting' the atheologians by embracing conclusions (2), (3) and (4) that should be re-interpreted as absurdities to which Anselmian theism is being reduced. I say this because (2), (3) and (4) will strike many of us as counter-intuitive. For these conclusions evacuate divine goodness of any content other than saying that God is essentially not-wicked. Let me emphasize, however, that I am not criticizing Almeida's brilliant deduction of these conclusions from his Anselmian premises. I am instead judging that we should use modus tollens not modus ponens. That is, instead of accepting these conclusions I would infer that the Anselmian premises are not all true. For what it is worth, I find it plausible that God has no essentially moral character whatever. God acts well precisely because for an agent in God's situation it is unreasonable not to act well. This requires, to be sure, the thesis that good reasons for acting do not necessitate those actions of metaphysical necessity. As Leibniz put it they incline without necessitating. Even though the epistemic probability that a perfectly sane individual will do what reason dictates is 100%, the individual still has the power to do otherwise. (Maybe it is analytic that a perfectly sane individual will do what reason dictates, but in that case it is not analytic that God remains perfectly sane.)

To be fair to Almeida, conclusion (5) shows that even though divine goodness is almost exhausted of content, there is scope for seeing redemption as an astoundingly good feature of the world God in fact actualizes. So we arrive at the thesis that God's essential goodness puts almost no constraint on divine creativity but in fact God chooses to save all or some of us. Provided Hell is much like a certain popular conception of Heaven, that is, a pleasant although decidedly second-best alternative to genuine Heaven, his conclusions would seem to show that God's essential goodness is compatible with the damnation of the many and the salvation of the few. All very Calvinist but, I submit, it just shows that God's essential goodness is not good enough.

Conclusion (1) is detachable from the rest of Almeida's argument, and I take it to be a reductio not of divine necessary goodness so much as divine omnipotence understood as the capacity to do anything it is at the time possible that God does. For (1) is based on a distinction between causing and bringing about, and so, incidentally, provides an interesting response to Evan Fales' thesis in Divine Intervention, that a non-spatial God cannot cause something to happen at one place rather than another. No doubt there is a narrow sense of cause that can be distinguished from bringing something about, but if we enjoy the dignity of being free in a libertarian sense this is, I submit, incompatible with our actions being brought about by some other agent. I conclude that God's omnipotence implies merely that God can perform any act (described appropriately) that is possible in the circumstances, where the circumstances include not merely the past but, in the case of prediction, the truth of what is predicted.

A point worth noting is that much of the book reads as if the intended audience are Molinists. This is because Anselmian theism is combined with bivalence about future contingents and counterfactuals. Bivalence seems, however, to be required only for future conditionals and that only to derive (1). I take it, therefore, that Almeida is being neutral, and so at pains to make his position compatible with Molinism rather than assuming it.

Nonetheless, the discussion (in chapters two and three) of universal transworld depravity and variants relies on the Molinist definition of a feasible world as one that is constrained by the counterfactuals of human freedom, so God can only actualize feasible worlds. Universal transworld depravity may then be stated as the thesis that in every feasible world every significantly free creature always does wrong. Although it is implausible that this thesis is true, it is initially plausible that Plantinga is right in saying that it is metaphysically possible. The possibility of universal transworld depravity would provide a reply to the version of the logical argument from evil that takes as its premise the indisputable fact that this is not a morally perfect world. Almeida rejects this thesis because of conclusion (1), which does not require Molinism but 'merely' bivalence about the actual future.

In fact genuine Molinism seems to provide an easy proof that God's goodness is consistent with any amount of this-worldly moral and other evils. For even though freedom is to be distinguished from chance we can consider the epistemic probability of someone making a certain choice as if it were a matter of chance, in which the different choices are probabilistically independent. Hence it is epistemically possible, although improbable, that, however dismal our assessment of this world, ours is the least bad feasible world in which everyone capable of free choice freely chooses eventually to accept the divine offer of genuine Heaven, involving a loving relation with God and each other in the afterlife. It is epistemically possible for instance that there is a variant on our world that is simply splendid except that just one creature, Lucifer say, chooses to reject God's offer. If we knew this to be the case, it would not merely be selfish but irrational to complain that God should have actualized this splendid world instead of ours which is this-worldly dismal. This way of short-circuiting much of the difficult discussion of transworld depravity requires, however, that we genuinely believe in Molinism, rather than aspiring to neutrality.

This is a brilliant book, although Almeida writes for fellow philosophers of religion not for people unfamiliar with academic philosophy. Probably that is a good thing since proposing counter-intuitive theodicy is likely to exasperate them.


I am grateful to Michael Almeida for reading a draft of this review and alerting me to a source of possible confusion.