Freedom's Right: The Social Foundations of Democratic Life

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Axel Honneth, Freedom's Right: The Social Foundations of Democratic Life, Joseph Ganahl (tr.), Columbia University Press, 2014, 412pp., $35.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780231162463.

Reviewed by Terry Pinkard, Georgetown University


John Rawls' A Theory of Justice brought Kantian approaches to center stage in political philosophy. After that came an avalanche of articles and books on Rawls' theory itself and on how Kantian Rawls really was. It has taken some time, but now, with Axel Honneth's book, the Hegelian development of Kantianism is moving slowly to its own place on center stage. It will also most likely produce a similar wave of articles and books on how Hegelian he really is. Overall, the differences are clear: whereas Rawls and his successors focused on a few general principles of justice and how they were to be specified, Honneth-the-Hegelian stresses history, sociology, and the way the principles take on different lives in different actualizations. But how Hegelian is Honneth? Since his book makes no claim to being an exegesis of Hegel but only to be broadly Hegelian, it is best to begin with a look at what it is that Honneth is trying to do.

Honneth's project is to take up Hegel's key ideas and update them in light of all that happened since Hegel's death in 1831. Strikingly, he does not use the 1807 Phenomenology as his touchstone -- as so many political revivals of Hegel in the 20th century did -- but the 1820 Philosophy of Right. Striking, because many major Hegel commentators in our time -- such as Robert Pippin -- hold that notwithstanding the brilliance of that later work, in it Hegel simply placed his bets on the wrong horses. His famous triad of family, civil society, and state looks wildly outdated. Worse, his comments about the family and women sometimes read like self-styled parodies of sexist writing (as when he says that men are like animals, but women are like plants), his civil society seems vastly out of touch with the decidedly uncivil corporate and market forces of globalized capitalism, and his state, although constitutional and representative, is authoritarian and non-democratic.

Explicating Hegel, however, is not Honneth's game. Instead, he wants to offer what he calls a normative reconstruction of Hegel's basic points. (Normative reconstruction is his version of, or replacement for, Hegel's dialectic.) The main point is Hegel's claim that we understand all the varieties of the right in terms of the way they actualize freedom. This is the root of Honneth's theory: an institution or practice takes its legitimacy and determinacy in terms of how it actualizes freedom in better or worse fashion.

In good Frankfurt critical theory mode, Honneth claims that this involves coming up with an overall recipe for how to combine the features of mainstream philosophy -- with its analysis of concepts, its attention to fine-grained distinctions and the like -- with empirical sociology and history to produce a kind of hybrid philosophical/empirical account. Normative reconstruction, he says, is a "procedure [that] implements the normative aims of a theory of justice through social analysis, taking immanently justified values as a criterion for processing and sorting out the empirical material." (p. 6) This of course raises the bar for success very high. Not only do all the philosophical arguments have to be in order, one also has to produce interpretations of social movements and historical developments -- all of which are contentious -- to make the case. This also makes summarizing Honneth's claims all the more difficult.

Honneth spends a good bit of the introduction going over the reasons he thinks that post-Rawlsian proposals for various abstract principles of justice are, however helpful they otherwise may be, nonetheless deficient and perhaps partially misleading. The basic claim -- articulated more subtly by Honneth than I am stating it here -- is that such purely normative theories are divorced from the practical realities they claim to govern, and in the worst instances, they become merely rational reconstructions of an irrational social reality. We human agents give and ask for reasons, but we always do that within various structures of power and economic force. Philosophy cannot look away from the world the principles claim to govern and pay no regard to those kinds of distortions.

Honneth's aim is nothing but audacious. Like Hegel, he claims that all the various practices and principles with which we would be concerned in our modern world should be evaluated in terms of how they actualize one principle: Freedom. However, this abstract principle requires supplementation by other more concrete principles, institutions and practices for us to get a true sense of what it involves and why it is important.

To get his case going, Honneth gives an analytical and historical overview of three conceptions of freedom he takes to have been at work in (at least Western) history. He has long, interesting discussions of negative freedom (freedom from interference by others) and reflexive freedom (self-determination, making one's own choices). However, interesting and important as those two versions of freedom are, it is only when he turns to the third form, social freedom, that his book gains its focus. Honneth accepts Frederick Neuhouser's critiques of these two forms -- basically that negative freedom cannot make sense of self-determination, and self-determination must in the end regard its own autonomy in opposition to a heteronymous social reality confronting it. He also takes over Neuhouser's third form of freedom (social freedom) which, unlike the first two, is an individual's freedom that can only be made real by his or her relationship to others. Social freedom is not equivalent to the idea of freedom plus the social resources to actualize it, nor is it the idea that some things require more than one person. (You can't really tango alone.) This kind of sociality, Honneth argues, is prior to all our other activities of detaching ourselves from that social reality, and negative and reflexive freedom turn out only to make sense when viewed as embedded in social freedom.

This makes all the difference for our conception of justice:

Justice must entail granting all members of society the opportunity to participate in institutions of recognition. This means that certain normatively substantive and thus 'ethical' institutions requiring legal security, state authority and civil support shift to the centre of our idea of social justice. (p. 61)

In such a system of justice, negative freedom and reflexive freedom are required so that individuals may and can act on their unreflected preferences, that is, a sphere where there is good reason not to require us to give reasons for our acts when we are asked, or where we can at least focus on our own aims. The first two entitle us in delimited circumstances to retreat from the social world in order to explore the meaning and aims of our individual lives (morality as reflexive freedom is, of course, also more than that). The third, on the other hand, throws us squarely back into the social arena to give us a sphere of communicative action. In social freedom, we encounter each other in mutual recognition such that, when the practices are going well, each is recognized as a condition of the other's freedom. Hegel's structure for the 1820 Philosophy of Right -- Abstract Right, Morality and Ethical Life -- is put to work to flesh this out.

Abstract Right? Well, without, for example, an entitlement to property, we would have trouble building up a stable identity and thinking about what certain kinds of "things" mean to us. These kinds of subjective rights (as German legal language describes them) of abstract right are thus necessary to developing the kind of ethical self-examination that is crucial to living a free life. It follows from the institutional logic of this that certain social rights are necessary in contemporary conditions for individuals to be able to exercise and take advantage of these liberal, subjective rights.

Morality? That turns out to be a case of reflexive freedom, although in morality it also involves giving reasons when demanded. However, if the story ended there at abstract right and morality, all we would have is the exercise of such rights leading to individuals isolating themselves. Political rights are what bring them back together. Political rights demand not that individuals reflect solely about themselves but engage instead in democratic interaction. In this sphere, we cannot retreat from giving reasons when asked for them.

One of the big mistakes in contemporary theory, according to Honneth, is to treat all of this through the lens of legal theory. That model inevitably ends up reducing freedom to our subjective rights, and it leads to various social pathologies, ways in which the actors in a social order are falsely interpreting their practices. Just as there can be pathologies of legal freedom (where everything becomes interpreted as a matter of subjective rights), there can also be pathologies of moral (reflexive) freedom, showing up as either extreme moralism or as some people seeing their actions as exempt from ordinary ethical restrictions since they take themselves to be answering to a "higher" morality. Social pathologies thus play a similar role to Aristotle's conception of regimes and their deviations (such as when virtuous aristocracy deviates into self-interested oligarchy).

In a well-ordered society, legality and morality play essential roles in the actualization of freedom, and the pathologies that partially arise out of their misinterpretation are kept in check by the institutions of social freedom functioning well. For that, the institutions of Hegel's Sittlichkeit -- family, civil society, and state -- are brought into play but in a highly modified way. To do this, Honneth turns to history and sociology to see what, if anything, is really still at work in Hegel's 19th century framework.

In Honneth's reconstruction, Hegel's "family" is replaced by what we might call relationships in which new and still developing forms of intimacy are being given expression and shaped. As with Hegel, friendship offers a paradigm case of individual freedom being possible only within a structured social framework. In the case of families, on the other hand, there has been so much change in the inner dynamics since Hegel's day that it is hard to see the resemblance, and Hegel's "marriage" has to be revised to include gay marriage, civil unions, etc. Moreover, the family is now better conceived as a community for solidarity, which for Honneth is a plus. Nonetheless, it is a mistake to assimilate familial relationships to other ones (such as friendship). It is also crucial to see that democratic communities depend on the structure of families and on free intimate relationships (unbound, for example, by traditional gender roles). The typical agnosticism about the family found in liberal theory is thus wrong-headed. Hegel was on the right track, but history and sociology require us in a "normative reconstruction" to update that track to see what it is still headed in the right direction.

Civil society? Honneth is audaciously ambitious here in responding to the worry that our ferociously global form of finance and consumer capitalism is so different from Hegel's more genteel corporatist idea of civil society that little is to be learned from any of Hegel's own normative reconstruction. Instead, Honneth defends the modified Hegelian approach that if the market is to be justified, it must be in terms of its embodying a form of cooperation that realizes social freedom and not just negative freedom. To get at this, he provides his own interpretation of the last two hundred years of capitalist development to show how the ravages of the unfettered market were countered by social movements and resistance that shaped a modern welfare state that can at least stake a claim to being the kind of cooperative institution that can have a place in a well ordered society.

Just listing the issues Honneth discusses under the rubric of civil society would take up too much space. Alienation, exploitation, ecology, consumerism, market regulation, consumer protection, corporate governance, globalization, immigration, biopolitics, the growing inequality of wealth, co-determination of management and labor, conspicuous consumption, the emerging service proletariat -- there are many more but there is no room here to list them. For Honneth, all of these issues are to be evaluated in terms of whether they really play a constructive role in actualizing social freedom. Honneth concedes that since "there do not seem to be any practical alternatives to the economic system of the market," the "challenges posed by the market's own normative promise . . . can thus only be solved within the market system itself," (p. 196), and he concludes that we now possess the elements for a way to embed the market in a legitimate system of social freedom. However, as he also argues, in the last several years, the market has so detached itself from such ethical constraints that it is hovering on the edge of losing its ethical legitimacy almost altogether.

The state? Here the social pathologies that hover around all the institutions Honneth discusses have been most prominent in the 20th century. Ethnically fired nationalism, Nazism, genocide: these are well known and too prominent to ignore. Nonetheless, Honneth argues that there are still tendencies that would make the political community (a better substitute for "state") into a locus of freedom, and he turns to John Dewey as updated by Habermas for help in making his case for updating Hegel. Dewey's conception of a democratic public in which individuals communicate and make use of their intelligence to solve problems can be used to update the civil part of civil society. However, once again, after an impressive and biting normative reconstruction of recent history, sociological study and cultural commentary, Honneth's prognosis is not exactly sanguine. He thinks that the idea of constitutional patriotism as the normative glue that would hold democratic societies together is too bereft of any emotional commitment to be much help. He is even more skeptical about any positive role that the web and social media might be able to play. The result? Citizens feel less and less empowered, apathy and drift are the order of the day, and journalism, which in Dewey's original conception was supposed to help steer public debate, has become more and more a wing of the entertainment industry. (Had Dewey witnessed the development of the news media in our time, he might have collapsed into a very non-Deweyian despair.) To the extent that "democratic will-formation [is] the active centre of the entire institutional order," (p. 329) there is reason to be very dissatisfied with the current conditions of "freedom's right."

There are, however, countervailing tendencies that point to a future for the struggle for recognition and freedom. He sides with the cosmopolitans' idea that confining one's studies and principles only to bounded political communities like the nation-state no longer makes any sense in our globalized conditions. He looks at the way labor movements have opened up new paths of resistance to the disintegration of social freedom. Feminist struggles for recognition have opened new possibilities. Once again, the list is too long to state, and the arguments and sociology too diverse to summarize.

Just as Rawls raised the bar for success in calling for his theory to provide the grounds of acceptable agreement in the tumult of pluralist liberal democracy, Honneth has raised the bar for his own success. Not only does he have to convince us of his general theory of agency, he also has to convince us that his interpretations of various historical movements are correct. Has he done it? Should he be more rather than less Hegelian?

In his past work, Honneth appealed to three basic needs -- love, esteem, respect -- which require specific kinds of practices and institutional embodiments to be adequately met. Those embodiments roughly corresponded to Hegel's family, civil society, and state. Although those needs do not make many appearances in his new book, they are nonetheless all there, and are more than just contending for the role of best supporting actors. Honneth's Hegelianism is very much a matter of how basic needs are to be satisfied and how, in addition to being merely thwarted, they can also manifest a misdevelopment (Fehlentwicklung, development in the wrong direction). The idea there is roughly Aristotelian: humans develop in lots of ways, but some developments go wrong. Moreover, human agents need the right kind of political and social institutions in order to secure that their developments do not go wrong. When the institutions in which people develop incline the development in the wrong direction, we get the social pathologies of which he speaks. In Honneth's telling, these are also pathologies of reason since when we suffer from social pathologies, we are unable, as it were, to draw the right practical conclusions about our lives, and this misdevelopment shows up in various psychological manifestations (depression, drift, ennui, etc.). Where they go wrong is not that we are not flourishing, but that we are no longer experiencing our own freedom as being enabled by others. Such freedom is identified by Honneth in several places as self-legislation (rendered in the translation as autonomy), and the full version has to be something like: I can acquire and exercise the capacities for such self-legislation only by living in certain types of relations to others. We are deeply socially and psychologically dependent on each other in various ways, and when that dependency goes awry, we go awry.

There are lots of different ways to read Hegel, and this review certainly is not going to settle which is correct. However, to try to stay judiciously dispassionate, we can say that this particular way of reading Hegel as Aristotle-aiming-at-freedom is contentious. Not all Hegel interpreters agree on this, but there is one line of interpretation that argues that Hegel is not aiming at such an account in terms of psychological-social development, as Honneth does, but at something more along the line of our agency being constituted in historical time in large part through the very contestations in collective ensembles over what it means even to be such an agent. We odd mammals fall under the concept of agency by bringing ourselves under the concept of living agent, and that happens in social space and historical time, in which collective attempts at establishing all the contours of such agency are often at odds with each other.

For example, Aristotle thought he had given cogent reasons for populating the political disputants in the polis with self-sufficient men and excluding women and slaves. I do not know of anybody now in philosophy who thinks that Aristotle got that right, but it is not at all clear that this failure lay only in his blindly overlooking certain facts about the way that women were being thwarted in their development. As Hegel put it in his Encyclopedia, §482, Aristotle, great as he was, simply failed to have an adequate conception of freedom as involving both our general concept of agency and its worldly, social reality. And, although that conception of how freedom's concept and freedom's reality had come to be on the main agenda of modern life, it was not the kind of thing that could have been clear at all even to Aristotle, one of the smartest and most inquisitive people to have walked the planet. Although where Geist is concerned, we retrospectively make it true that Aristotle was wrong about women and slaves, that also involves all the brilliance of twenty-twenty hindsight. (Hegel did not think that we could make the laws of nature retrospectively true or false.)

Honneth argues that there is indeed a human nature that is deeply social, that finds its realization in various social and political engagements, and that there are better and worse ways to send that development in the right direction. Moreover, those better and worse ways are also deeply historically inflected. Hegel, on the other hand, thought that the very concept of an agent was itself deeply conceptual, even metaphysical, at least in the sense that questions such as, "Should we say that this super-well programmed robot is an agent?", do not seem to be wholly empirical questions (not something to be decisively answered by attending to some recent psychological studies) yet they are nonetheless often issues of intense social contestation. It is difficult to see how the discovery of a new fact would settle that account, and even the assertion that, say, the findings of the neurosciences will settle the matter is itself a contentious, contested and not clearly wholly empirical claim.

In such social contestations, there is a struggle for recognition (a concept which Honneth has made his trademark). There are all too many examples in history where one group (more powerful, better armed) decided that some other humans were deficient agents or even perhaps not agents at all (since maybe they lacked souls), only to find that the people they had so classified fought back and demanded recognition, claiming that their development was being misdirected and that the status the conquerors imposed was degrading and false. In such contestations, which can run the gamut from intense discussions in graduate seminars to great practical resistance on the part of people resisting the imputation of lesser capacity for agency to themselves, it is not clear that we can get outside the historical, developmental status of the ways we hold each other to reasons and settle it with arguments brought in from sociology and psychology. But it is also not clear that we sometimes cannot. It depends on what the struggle is about.

That struggle over recognition is also a struggle over what counts as reasons in the struggle, and lands us squarely with questions of social norms and how such norms can be redeemed as genuine reasons instead of, for example, being merely well disguised assertions of power. That in turn, so Hegel argued, pushes us to ask whether there is a deeper logic to what is involved in giving and asking for reasons such that some type of putative reasons historically turn out to not really have been good reasons, however much in sync with the times they were.

For the Hegelian, as for Honneth, reasons are embedded deeply in practices, and they function in the background that links us together. However, they come into question when lives led with that set of background reasons turn out (sometimes because of the relations of domination at work in them) to be uninhabitable and thus not really rational (even though perhaps fully in keeping with the accepted norms of the time.) In Hegel's own Aristotle-inflected jargon, the philosophical question has to do with which of those reasons are actual, wirklich. To put things in this way, the Hegelian has to come to terms with the specter of an all too facile historicism that hovers around these issues and prompts many to hold that whatever else is the case, there has to be some Archimedean point, some inviolable and unchangeable core of morality at work in human history such that the penalties for ignoring such an unchanging core are nonsense in philosophy and meaninglessness in practice.

Honneth responds to that worry with the view that agency is rooted in certain psychological-social developmental facts, and what counts as the actual reasons (so he seems to suggest) are those provoked by our nature as Aristotelian-agents seeking freedom in ways that involve our deep social bonds to others. Hegel, on the other hand, seems to suggest that reasons rise and fall with the kinds of demands for justification and struggles against norms that pretend, but fail, to be reasons. Hegel's response to the worry about losing touch with some core norms was to argue for a logic to this development that involved the way in which our concepts come into friction with each other and with objectivity, which then provokes different ways of conceiving the link between concept and world. (As he states over and over again, what he calls the Idea is the unity of concept and objectivity, and history is the development, in his non-standard way of talking, of the Idea.)

At that point, Honneth and Hegel are in a kind of pact. Ideas of agency and justice cannot be evaluated apart from the material conditions in which they are actualized. Dyed in the wool Hegelians would, however, suspect that under pressure, Honneth's synthesis will have to mutate into Hegel's contestations of what reasons we owe each other and ourselves and whether there is or can be a deeper logic to that kind of giving and asking for reasons. Honneth has a powerful view to the effect that we need to pay closer attention to the ways institutions (such as those of relationships and the family) make a difference to how other large scale institutions (such as democracy) function, and that part of the problem in our time is the way segments of contemporary life are thwarting the development of freedom or inclining it in the wrong direction. Hegelians tend to think that the issue is about reason's struggle with itself, about what ultimately matters to us, and that remains as contested as ever. For Honneth, that Hegelian Idea needs to pay more attention to reality, and that means we do not need Hegelian logic as much as we need better sociology, psychology and historical research. Is Honneth's way the best or the only plausible way to take up the Hegelian idea of justice as itself developing in history? The jury's still out.