Freedom to Fail: Heidegger's Anarchy

Placeholder book cover

Peter Trawny, Freedom to Fail: Heidegger's Anarchy, Ian Alexander Moore and Christopher Turner (trs.), Polity, 2015, 101pp., $12.95 (pbk), ISBN 9780745695235.

Reviewed by Gregory Fried, Suffolk University


There are few scholars more intimately familiar with the work of Martin Heidegger than Peter Trawny. He is the editor of ten volumes of Heidegger's Collected Works, including the four volumes of the so‑called "Black Notebooks" published so far, in 2014 and 2015, with more to follow -- although it remains to be seen if Trawny will be their editor.

The Black Notebooks (so named for the color of their bindings) have ignited a firestorm of toxic debate in scholarly circles, especially in Europe. Comprising notes and experimental writings beginning in 1931, the Notebooks offer decisive evidence that Heidegger understood his involvement with National Socialism as inspired by his own philosophy and that he harbored anti‑Semitic views. Trawny, to his credit, has not shied away from these revelations. In 2014, simultaneous with the appearance of the first Black Notebooks, he published Heidegger and the Myth of a Jewish World Conspiracy, which argued that Heidegger's anti-Semitism was rooted in his account of the history of Being, a charge that cuts to quick, for it implicates the deepest currents of Heidegger's thought.[1]

To have published such a book is evidence of intellectual courage. On the one hand, the book exposed Trawny to attacks from the orthodox Heideggerians, who, because they exert a degree of control over Heidegger scholarship in Germany, could harm his career prospects, at least as a continuing editor of the Collected Works. Consider what Friedrich-Wilhelm von Herrmann, the master-editor of the Heidegger corpus, had to say about Trawny: that the "scandal" of the Black Notebooks is not their negligible (he claims) anti-Semitic passages, but rather "the distorted and deeply disparaging, deeply corrupt reading of these passages" by "the editor" (von Herrmann does not even deign to mention Trawny by name).[2] On the other hand, François Rastier, a scholar inveterately hostile to Heidegger, has accused Trawny of "editorial manipulations," and Jürg Altwegg has anointed him one of a party of "whitewashers," because he thinks Trawny has not gone far enough in condemning Heidegger.[3]

Now Trawny has published this short book, really an extended essay or meditation, that pushes intellectual courage to its limits. Its German title is Irrnisfuge: Heideggers Anarchie.[4]. The book's gambit is to argue for the absolute freedom of philosophy, Heidegger's in particular. In making the case for this freedom, Trawny attempts to walk a razor-thin line by arguing that despite Heidegger's involvement with National Socialism, it is in the very nature of any genuine philosophy to risk such catastrophic error. Trawny leaves no doubt that he believes Heidegger's thought to be genuine in this way.

Robert Bernasconi, in a blurb on the  back cover, says that this book "will be of value to specialists as well as beginners," but the difficulty of the conceptual vocabulary will make it a challenge to those new to Heidegger. The translators, Ian Alexander Moore and Christopher Turner, have done an admirable job with the text, but as they themselves acknowledge, even the title is hard to render. Freedom to Fail is how they translate Irrnisfuge, which they suggest might more poetically be rendered as "Errancy-fugue"; as Moore and Turner point out, Irrnis is an unusual word even in German, and that "As Heidegger employs it, it refers to an originary site of error, rather than to a particular error" (vi). This is as good a place as any to start, because to understand Trawny's thesis, one must unpack a good deal of Heideggerian terminology, to which Trawny owes a deep allegiance.

Moore and Turner are right that for both Heidegger and Trawny, Irre, error, and Irrnis, errancy, do not mean error in the sense of mistake about truth claims or moral conduct. Here it is worth pointing out Heidegger's own motto for his Collected Works: Wege, nicht Werke, "ways, not works."[5] The metaphor of the "way" permeates Heidegger's understanding of what it means to do philosophy: animated by powerful questions, thinking is always under way, never brought to rest in the form of doctrines and treatises (what Heidegger means by "works"). The impetus of that questioning may send thinking down Holzwege, or "woodpaths," that is, off the beaten track. It is, therefore, in the more archaic English sense of a "knight errant" that we must understand errancy in Heidegger: set out on the quest of a question, hazarding false starts, accidents, dead ends, as well as unexpected discoveries, all along the way.

And so Trawny says, "Our thinking and acting, especially, though not only, in the political community, is exposed to an‑archic freedom -- 'originary errancy'" (41). By "an‑archic," Trawny does not mean political anarchy, but rather the absence of an archê, a ruling principle, cause, or foundation that constrains thinking in advance. Here, Trawny follows a lead laid down by the late Reiner Schürmann nearly 30 years ago in his classic, Heidegger on Being and Acting: From Principles to Anarchy.[6] An‑archic freedom, for Trawny, is a freedom from principle (21), which does not mean rank a-moralism but rather the stance of thinking that is pre-moral and pre-doctrinal. "To be a philosopher means to be free" in this sense, says Trawny (20), because to ask a question worth asking, either about how to act or about what we know, means not being tied down in advance by some answer, or even some premise, as a given.

One can, Trawny argues, either relate to "freedom as the criterion of a moral action" or engage in "freedom as a play‑space" (20). The first option, though, would mean that philosophy is hemmed in by a "criterion" prior and therefore alien to genuinely free thought. "Play-space" rings jejune or precious in English, but it translates Spielraum, which, as Moore and Turner point out (91, fn. 35), means "leeway" or "elbow room" in ordinary German. If sacrosanct criteria constrain thinking in advance, then it has no "room" to breathe, no freedom of movement on its way, no real authority to "play" with ideas.

Against all such external authoritas is the an‑archic freedom that Trawny, following Heidegger, sees as responsible for "originary errancy": originary because it is the foundationless ground for the setting-out of philosophy as freedom; errant because, without criteria, without guard-rails, thinking must always risk falling into error in the ordinary sense whenever it takes up the quest of genuine questioning.

Trawny goes even further: not only is philosophy prone to error in its errancy, it is doomed to such error: "we must go astray; foundering is inevitable" (41). Philosophy is in its essence tragic, and this is because of our finitude (41-43). Human finitude means that our thinking is always already bounded by historical horizons. The "finitude of philosophy" indicates that "thinking is not capable of surveying the totality of meanings" (32) and is therefore bound to stumble along its path. Our concepts are given by language and tradition, and however much freedom we grant to philosophy in deconstructing and reconstructing our inherited views, we will never get behind that givenness of our way of being so as to reconstitute the world as a whole, free from unexamined assumptions, a pure representation of reality in the lingua mentis of God. This means that whenever we set out to think by pursuing a question to its limits, we will, sooner or later, run up against our own limits. Like Oedipus, we are destined to fail in a way that we could not "see" in advance. To accept this tragic essence of human freedom is to affirm and return to ourselves within those limits as mortal, not infinite, beings. Hence the translators' rendering of the title of Irrnisfuge as Freedom to Fail. Indeed, Trawny's Heidegger challenges us to take on the burden the tragic narrative of human existence: "Be Oedipus!" (58).

This is where Trawny pushes his commitment to Heidegger's way of thinking to its utmost limit, and it is also where we can most clearly see what is at stake in taking Heidegger seriously as a philosopher after the Black Notebooks: whether we can accompany Heidegger on a path that led him, by Trawny's own admission, into National Socialism. Trawny does not mince words: "The one who errs is without guilt. The thought that Heidegger could have somehow apologized for his thinking is weak" (73). That is a remarkable, even shocking, proclamation. Is Trawny siding with the Nietzschean notion that the great artist or thinker or statesman is beyond moral judgment, beyond good and evil?

To do Trawny justice, we must be precise: by his argument, errancy is not the same as error. To err in Trawny's (or Heidegger's) sense is to engage in the an‑archic freedom of thinking; it is a way of being as thinking. Error is a mistaken act or judgment or statement, which can only be categorized a posteriori according to the criteria (however provisional) advanced by thinking. So, if thinking is by its essence ab‑errant, then thinking as such cannot be guilty, even if specific actions or views or people can be. It is errant thinking, not Heidegger the person, that is "without guilt" for Trawny.

This is asking us to walk a very fine line indeed. How far can we push the right of philosophy to think and to question? This is a problem as ancient as Athens putting Socrates on trial for impiety, and we see it in Aristophanes' earlier portrayal of Socrates in The Clouds as a man whose free‑thinking threatens the norms of both conventional belief and social conduct. We may prefer Plato's more ostensibly flattering portrait of Socrates, but Aristophanes' lampooning of him exposes a genuine problem, because philosophy as errant does more than to undermine received opinion: it willingly risks the freedom of saying or doing something that in retrospect appears genuinely culpable. But by whose standard? The Socrates of The Clouds seems to be immune to any sense of culpability; in questioning, he feels no shame in the face of any established authority, human or divine, or in disintegrating what others hold sacred. Wherever we run up against the limit of questioning, that is where we capitulate to an authority, and that is where thinking ends. We can even crave an authority imposed upon us, external or internalized, if we fear our own errant freedom.[7]

We have certainly experienced remarkable examples of such destabilizing questioning over the past fifteen years. In the early 2000s, the United States (and it was not alone in this) began to entertain the question: Should same-sex couples be allowed to marry? Now we are asking: Should transgender people be allowed to use bathrooms of their choosing? Such questions are the consequence of thinking that was nearly unthinkable less than a generation ago. Whatever you think of these questions, and the answers our society has been proposing to them, what is remarkable is the expression of a freedom in the form of a questing questioning that does not abide the authority of long‑accepted criteria for what counts as righteous. These questions presume some sense of justice as their polestar, and that may seem very far afield from Heidegger's abstruse "question of Being," but they serve to make vivid what is at stake in giving free range to thinking‑as‑questioning, and precisely because of Heidegger's political entanglements, the question of justice cannot simply be cordoned off from his work, as Trawny recognizes.

But how far can we go with this absolute right of anarchic freedom? Same-sex marriage? Yes, we now seem to answer. Transgender rights? Perhaps. We are considering it. But what if someone wants to think about whether authoritarianism might after all be a better form of government than what we have now? Or, what if they want to take seriously the question of whether there might be something to Aristotle's argument in favor of natural slavery? What about whether, contrary to received scientific opinion, race is a meaningful way to understand human biology and human justice? What about someone who wants to ask uncomfortable questions about the Holocaust, not even to doubt its reality, even, but simply to challenge received orthodoxy, such as Daniel Goldhagen did with Hitler's Willing Executioners twenty years ago, provoking widespread controversy?[8]

If you began to bristle at these progressively more unsettling questions, then you have run up against your own piety, secular or not. To be very clear: I share that modern, democratic, anti‑fascist, American (but surely not only American) piety. But this is precisely Trawny's point, I believe, about the truly radical nature of genuinely free, an‑archic thinking: it must allow no piety to stand in the way of a question that might be illuminating in unexpected ways. This is one way of understanding Heidegger's claim in 1922 that "Philosophy, in its radical, self‑posing questionability, must be a‑theistic as a matter of principle"[9] -- where the divinity is any supreme principle, from divine command to Kant's categorical imperative, presuming to rule over the bounds of thought a priori. It is also why Heidegger might say that "questioning is the piety of thinking": the only piety thinking recognizes or indeed experiences is the an‑archic freedom to follow a question wherever it may lead, without being hobbled by guilt or shame.[10]

And yet, why should we tolerate such freedom? Is there no difference, then, between sociopathy and an‑archic freedom? Is there not a supreme danger in allowing our pieties to be questioned like this? Surely that's what the Athenians thought when they put Socrates on trial. Is it not precisely when we give way to such questions that the fabric of our society begins to fray and demagogues and aspirant tyrants elbow their way onto the historical stage?

Trawny's point seems to be that this is indeed the price we must be willing to pay for our freedom to think. We have to be open to the errancy that can lead to error, because if we clamp down on that freedom, we go deaf to our most human calling, which is thinking as questioning. Yet Trawny remarks that "the praise of errancy has its limits": a profound mistrust of anything not plunged into a ponderous, apocalyptic thinking of Being led Heidegger into grandiose, errant narratives of history that fail to pay adequate attention "to the undramatic and tenacious fabric of the everyday," which is, after all, where we live, and such arrogance "can operate as an immunization of thinking" that risks "the danger of farce, indeed of buffoonery" (65).

Aristophanes would surely agree. So it is remarkable that Trawny says, "One does the thinker [i.e., Heidegger] an injustice if one reproaches him for having no humor" (66). Trawny duly notes that Heidegger lived and worked across two world wars and the Shoah; hardly laughing matters, if one is pious about human suffering. Trawny also acknowledges the parallel (if not equal) importance of tragedy and comedy ever since the Greeks: "While tragedy is great, insofar as it shows those who err, those who die, comedy is great insofar as it shows those who err, those who live" (66). He nevertheless says, "There is nothing about comedy, about the comic, in Heidegger's published writings. That is an observation, not a critique. Narrative has no obligation to be total" (67). The problem, though, is that Heidegger's narrative about the history of Being, as a story about the eruption of nihilistic metaphysics beginning with Plato and ending in the age of thoughtless technicity masquerading as rationality, is a totalizing narrative, and a tragic, apocalyptic one at that. Errancy is tragic for Heidegger, and if thinking is the soul of being human, then what room is there for comedy, for Don Quixote as a heroically ridiculous knight errant. What do we lose if we disregard him and emulate only Oedipus?

We lose another way of accepting our finitude: the limitations of physical, social, and conceptual specificity that crack us up, and yet end, as Trawny himself says, by pointing to life rather than death as the way to embrace our absurdities. Trawny rightly asks, "Who were the Greeks, that they could laugh about their gods?" (68). That's a good question! We forget, because they are almost entirely lost, that every Greek cycle of three tragic plays would conclude with a fourth: a satyr-play in which the gods and heroes of the previous drama were mercilessly lampooned. Socrates, at the end of the Symposium, argues that the truly great poet must be able to compose both tragedies and comedies. So, what is Heidegger missing, that he has no sense of humor, that he cannot laugh at himself, that he won't permit us to laugh at his buffooneries? That he won't think comedy, too, can be divine? Surely this has something to do with a Greek piety that allowed them to laugh even at the gods in their sacred theatrical rites. What is it to share that joyful, unconstrained laughter? Not only does it protect us from taking authority too seriously, including our own pretensions, it harbors within itself the seed of the right to think and to question, one that quickly withers and dies if we treat comedy as a merely amusing pass-time.

Trawny seems genuinely appalled by the Shoah, which for him, and the history of the West, "remains a trauma" (74). But on what basis can we condemn "errors" of the magnitude of enslavement and genocide if, as Trawny argues, assigning guilt and blame plays into a normative morality that turns its back on the necessarily tragic errancy of thinking? After asserting that philosophy and anti-Semitism, "like any ideological anti­‑," are "mutually exclusive" (presumably because ideology is a form of inauthentic piety that excludes questioning), Trawny asks a dangerous question: "what happens to philosophy when we attempt to exclude it in advance from the danger of anti-Semitism?" (16). Far from some covert attempt to let anti-Semitism in through the back door, Trawny is calling for a searing probity: "Overcoming anti-Semitism can only succeed by drawing near to it" (16). Again, it would be easy to misunderstand or distort Trawny as reckless or an apologist, but he is far from it: "Anti-Semitism is tenacious. The opinion that it is always others who are anti-Semites is a cop-out. It is 'I' who am the anti-Semite" (16). Trawny is on to something very important here: that we must not forget that both fascism and anti‑Semitism are not utterly alien to our history, and "drawing near" to them does not mean affirming them, but rather understanding their power as part of a history that we bear, all of us. We cannot confront them effectively in their novel forms without taking that ownership seriously.

But does this not run counter to Trawny's claim that an‑archic freedom is beyond guilt? We can agree that free-thought must be allowed its free-play to be what it is, to follow its path. But why should that absolve us of all responsibility to watch where we are going, and to laugh at ourselves if, like Thales, we are on course to fall down a well? If laughter can itself be pious by laughing at what is otherwise the object of reverence, this points to a dynamic that perhaps Trawny and certainly Heidegger have overlooked. The prospect of a pious impiety or of an impious piety implies that we do not have to reject and scorn "normative morality" entirely when we question and think, any more than the Greeks rejected their gods in composing and cracking up over satyr plays. In comedy, the world comes out whole again, despite running up against its limits. More concretely, if we oppose the rise of neo-fascism only by mouthing the same, tired liberal pieties, those idols will soon ring hollow, and the new avatars of tyranny will have the last laugh.

If thinking is errant, why can it not be a road trip that goes out and comes back, that breaks past the limits of the given strictures, but then returns home along new paths to replenish what Trawny has so evocatively called "the undramatic and tenacious fabric of the everyday"? To do this, we must have a faith that in confronting the norms by which we have lived hitherto, we will do those norms the most justice by thoughtfully reconstructing and transforming them in the face of our lived situation, here and now, and by leaving ourselves ever open to the question of when those norms need to be refurbished, or even discarded. Let that be the impious piety of thinking and perhaps sometimes our freedom may not have to be confirmed by disaster.

[1] See Trawny, Heidegger und der Mythos der jüdischen Weltverschwörung (Vittorio Klostermann, 2014), translated as Heidegger and the Myth of a Jewish World Conspiracy, by Andrew J. Mitchell (University of Chicago Press, 2015). See my review, "What Heidegger Was Hiding: Unearthing the Philosopher's Anti-Semitism," Foreign Affairs 93:6. (November 2014), 159-166.

[2] See von Herrmann, "The Role of Martin Heidegger's Notebooks within His Oeuvre," Reading Heidegger's Black Notebooks 1931-1941, ed. Ingo Farin and Jeff Malpas (MIT Press, 2016), pp. 91-92.

[3] Altwegg, "Ein Kongress der Weißwäscher?" Frankfurter Allgemeine Zeitung, January 21, 2015, web. Altwegg quotes Rastier in this article.

[4] Trawny, Irrnisfuge: Heideggers Anarchie (Matthes and Seitz, 2014).

[5] Heidegger, Frühe Schriften, Gesamtausgabe, vol. 1, ed. Friedrich-Wilhelm von Herrmann (Klostermann, 1978), second unnumbered page.

[6] Schürmann, Heidegger on Being and Acting: From Principles to Anarchy (Indiana University Press, 1987).

[7] My thanks to Richard Polt for discussion of this point.

[8] See Goldhagen, Hitler's Willing Executioners: Ordinary Germans and the Holocaust (Knopf, 1996). For an overview of its reception, see Adam Shatz, "Goldhagen's Willing Executioners: The attack on a scholarly superstar, and how he fights back," Slate (April 8, 1998), available online.

[9] Heidegger, Phenomenological Interpretations of Aristotle: Initiation into Philosophy, trans. Richard Rojcewicz (Indiana University Press, 2001), 148.

[10] Heidegger, The Question Concerning Technology and Other Essays, trans. William Lovitt (Garland, 1972), 35.