Frege on Thinking and its Epistemic Significance

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Pieranna Garavaso and Nicla Vassallo, Frege on Thinking and its Epistemic Significance, Lexington Books, 2015, 125pp., $75.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780739178386.

Reviewed by Clinton Tolley, University of California, San Diego


In this short book, Pieranna Garavaso and Nicla Vassallo aim to re-focus discussions of Frege toward two neglected aspects of his work: first, his understanding of 'thinking [denken]' as a distinctive kind of mental activity or process, and second, his conception of the epistemic significance of this activity, especially with respect to 'fostering the development of human knowledge' (1). After a short introduction positioning their work within Frege scholarship, especially that of Michael Dummett (Chapter 1), Garavaso and Vassallo take up the worry that, given his well-known anti-psychologism, Frege would have no interest in thinking as a psychological process (Chapter 2). In response, they chart out several dimensions of Frege's anti-psychologism about logic to make room for Frege's willingness nevertheless to discuss 'our apprehension of logic' and the acts of 'abstraction' needed to bring its subject-matter to 'consciousness' (32f). This leads to their positive account of Frege's views on thinking itself (Chapter 3), followed by a discussion of Frege's epistemology in light of these views (Chapter 4). The final chapter focuses on the function of language in enabling human thinking, by making thoughts and truths accessible to human consciousness (Chapter 5).

Garavaso and Vassallo's general approach will be congenial to several audiences. In focusing on Frege's account of thinking, rather than 'thoughts [Gedanken]' or the 'truth-values [Wahrheitswerthe]' of thoughts, their approach contrasts with two earlier, and perhaps still more widely familiar, approaches to Frege -- what might be called 'reference-' and 'sense-theoretical' approaches, respectively -- and promises to dovetail with a third, increasingly influential 'act-theoretical' approach, which aims to give priority to Frege's account of the mental activity that pertains to logic, such as judging, inferring, and proving. And in exploring the epistemic significance of thinking, Garavaso and Vassallo promise to further illuminate of the rationalistic epistemological foundations of Frege's logicist programme.

While there is therefore much of interest in the general orientation that Garavaso and Vassallo pursue, my focus will be on Chapters 3-4, and the respects in which their exposition leaves their two main themes (thinking and its epistemic significance) underdeveloped.

Let me first situate Garavaso and Vassallo's approach within recent Frege scholarship. Early interest in Frege trended toward the ontology (roughly speaking) of his account of the structure of the 'reference [Bedeutung]' of linguistic expressions. Russell's influential presentation of Frege's views in his 1903 Principles of Mathematics, for example, was explicitly critical of the latent psychologism Russell saw in Frege's doctrine of 'sense [Sinn]', and shifted attention instead toward sharper articulation of categorial divisions among objectivities referred to through language: objects, properties and relations (functions, including Frege's 'Begriffe'), truth-values, sets ('extensions'), etc. (see, e.g., Rulon Wells, Reinhardt Grossmann, and more recently, Richard Mendelsohn).

One of the many decisive influences of Dummett's work was to effect the broadening of interpretive focus beyond Frege's Bedeutungstheorie to include his account of sense, and in particular to accord pride of place to the sense expressed by assertoric sentences -- Frege's 'thoughts [Gedanken]' -- along with the compositional relations among sense-constituents of thoughts. In fact, Dummett argued that Frege's main philosophical ambition is to provide 'the philosophy of thought' (1981: 39), one according to which (pace Russell) 'thought' is understood in a suitably anti-psychologistic manner.

Dummett's Frege writings also left considerable imprints on then-emerging work exploring broadly Fregean accounts of sense and reference (Tyler Burge, Gareth Evans, John McDowell). But Dummett himself was sharply critical of the more platonistic aspects he found in Frege's doctrine of sense and thought, and the insufficient measure Frege took of the role that mental, cognitive, and communicative activity plays in shaping, and limiting, what sense, meaning, thought, and understanding could ever amount to, within human life. In the wake of these criticisms, a third, more recent, stream of Frege interpreters -- including David Bell, Robert Brandom, Thomas Ricketts, Joan Weiner, and Danielle Macbeth, among others -- have argued, against Dummett, that Frege himself already did much to incorporate an act-theoretic perspective into his accounts of reference (truth) and sense (thought), and have highlighted in particular Frege's discussions of 'judging [urteilen]' ('acknowledging [anerkennen]' truth), 'inferring [schliessen]', and other exercises of the capacity for 'reason [Vernunft]' (Tolley 2011).

These act-theoretical reframings of Frege have been further complemented by a wealth of recent rich historical-comparative work placing Frege's treatment of cognitive acts, along with his technical terminology for such acts, within the broader context of leading 19th-and early 20th-century post-Kantian accounts of cognitive activity developed within philosophy and philosophical psychology. These include instructive comparisons of Frege's account with Bolzano (Wolfgang Künne and Sandra Lapointe); Brentano (Michael Kremer); Husserl (Dagfinn Follesdal; see also David W. Smith and Ron McIntyre); and Kant and the neo-Kantians (Philip Kitcher, Hans Sluga, Wolfgang Carl, Eva Picardi, Gottfried Gabriel, among many others; compare Heis 2008).

Given Garavaso and Vassallo's focus on Frege's account of thinking, understood specifically as a mental act or process (5), one might expect that they would draw widely on efforts of both act-theoretical interpreters and post-Kantian recontextualists. Unfortunately, Garavaso and Vassallo engage very little with either set of discussions. (This is so despite indicating awareness of at least some of this work: 15n19, 15n21.) Rather, they target Dummett alone as 'the foil against which we characterize our positions', and 'our main interlocutor in contrast to other more recent and not yet as influential scholars' (8),[1] and they explicitly bracket in particular (7) the growing array of historico-contextual investigations mentioned above.

The sole exception to their bracketing of history comes in Garavaso and Vassallo's discussion of Boole, vis-a-vis Frege's anti-psychologism concerning logic and thought in Chapter 2 (26-34). Though informative in its own right, it does not make up for the omission of any substantive discussion of the arguably much more formative influence that post-Kantianism had upon Frege's conception of thinking and its relation to cognition and knowledge.[2] This omission is especially striking, given that the one interpreter besides Dummett that Garavaso and Vassallo explicitly discuss at length regarding Frege's epistemology is Wolfgang Carl (6, 64-65), who has developed one of the more systematic neo-Kantian interpretations of Frege -- though the authors are essentially silent on this aspect of Carl's work.

This omission also means that Garavaso and Vassallo do not attempt any comparison with a Kantian classification of the various types of thinking that humans are capable of, though this comparison would have been useful in helping to sharpen the precise import of their positive account of Frege on thinking (Chapter 3). Their main thesis is that, for Frege, there are three distinct 'types' of thinking (46-58): first, 'logical or pure' thinking, which is 'wholly devoid of psychological features such as emotive force, sensations, and ideas'; second, 'psychological' thinking, which is 'wholly imbued with' these features; and finally, a hybrid 'logical-psychological' thinking, which is 'neither pure nor psychological', but which is sufficiently logical so as to 'allow humans to grasp thoughts, to distinguish between the psychological and the logical, to isolate the logical element, and to build on its basis inferences that can be shared' (108), by being a thinking that 'combines features proper to both psychological and logical thinking' (53).

Several things about this interpretive taxonomy seem problematic. For one, the authors seem to take the purity of 'pure or logical' thinking to require that anything besides logical content be excluded from the mind altogether: in 'pure' thinking, the mind must be 'wholly devoid' of psychological features (53); not just that pure thinking 'need[s] no representation or idea', but that it has 'no psychological element' whatsoever (49; my ital.). Garavaso and Vassallo conclude that pure thinking cannot be 'embodied' in 'the mind of an individual subject', since the human mind always does 'include' a psychological element (53). This, however, seems hard to square with Frege's own use of 'pure thinking' to pick out what he himself is presenting (expressing, communicating) in the Begriffsschrift, itself subtitled: 'a formula-language of pure thinking [Formelsprache des reinen Denkens]' -- and hence expressing thinking (presumably) that Frege himself has been able to engage in.[3]

Secondly, even if everything psychological were somehow screened out from a thinking mind, it's not clear Frege would say that the thinking would then become purely logical. Garavaso and Vassallo seem to align the domain of the purely logical with thinking that grasps thoughts alone, as opposed to the other items (sensations, ideas, feelings, etc) associated with consciousness. Note, however, that thinking would then count as purely logical whether or not the thoughts involved are 'about' anything specifically logical. In Frege's own usage, by contrast, 'purely logical' thinking seems to require this further characteristic -- roughly: that the thoughts involved are about specifically logical subject-matter. This further restriction seems necessary since Frege accepts that all sciences (e.g., chemistry) engage with thoughts, though they are not thereby a part of pure logic, and he accepts, more generally, that all ordinary assertoric sentences express thoughts, even when they are 'about' non-logical subject-matter. Conversely, there does not seem to be anything prohibiting a mind whose thinking is not 'purely logical' in the authors' sense of also having representations occurring in the mind, from engaging with thoughts that are 'purely logical' in the sense of being solely about the subject-matter of logic. Again, compare the thinking Frege himself gives expression to in the Begriffsschrift and Grundgesetze, i.e., the kind of thinking made possible by sufficient logical investigations.[4]

What is perhaps most problematic, however, is Garavaso and Vassallo's third category of purely 'psychological' thinking. As they understand it, psychological thinking is composed entirely of items which 'cannot be aimed at thoughts' (57; my ital.). Only purely logical and the hybrid logical-psychological thinking that can 'aim at' thoughts (57); only these other types of thinking 'can give us epistemic access to those objective entities that are ontologically independent from us and that guarantee us knowledge' (58; compare 47-48, 53). 'Psychological thinking' is thus something purely 'subjective' (53), not because 'this thinking is dependent upon our ideas, that is, on our representations' (47), but because it is constituted wholly by an engagement with representations and 'images [Bilder]' -- rather than a grasping of thoughts -- from which they conclude that such thinking does not belong in 'an account of how we grasp thoughts' at all (48).

It is not clear how Frege himself could count as thinking any mental activity which not only does not successfully grasp a thought, but which cannot even aim at one. Indeed, the single condition that Frege seems to have for something's being thinking at all, rather than some other kind of mental act, is that it specifically involve 'grasping [fassen] a thought'; in 'Der Gedanke', Frege appears to simply identify 'the grasping a thought' with 'thinking' (cf. Frege 1918: 62). It is telling, therefore, that Garavaso and Vassallo refer to only one passage (from Frege's 1897 'Logik' manuscript) as directly supporting their claim that merely psychological thinking (thinking sans thought) is, for Frege, genuine thinking. A closer look at this passage, however, reveals only the weaker claim that 'thinking in human beings' is 'at first mixed with representations and feelings' (46) -- something compatible with human thinking 'at first' (and ever after) also including logical elements.[5]

Let me turn now to Garavaso and Vassallo's treatment of Frege's conception of the epistemic significance of thinking (Chapter 4). Here they focus on the fact that, for Frege, thinking is an act which serves as a general precondition for any act of knowing any truths, since grasping a thought is a general precondition to knowing its truth. They draw on Frege's late 1924-5 manuscript on the 'sources of cognition [Erkennntisquellen]' (71), where Frege sketches the following picture of knowledge: to have knowledge of something is to have knowledge that something is true about it; to have knowledge of a truth about something involves the knowledge ('recognition [Anerkennung]') that a thought about it is true; to recognize the truth of a thought involves grasping the thought itself in the first place -- and the act of grasping a thought is nothing other than thinking the thought (Frege 1924-5: 286).

Now, if Frege took the power of thinking to be restricted to that of grasping, the foregoing would imply that thinking and knowing are always distinct. As Garavaso and Vassallo rightly emphasize, Frege takes grasping a thought to be only necessary but not sufficient for knowledge (71-72), since knowledge requires both holding the thought to be true ('judging' it so, as Frege uses the term) and also having sufficient justification for doing so, e.g., through establishing a proof of the truth of the thought (74-75). What Garavaso and Vassallo never directly address, however, is a possibility so central to motivating Frege's logicism in the first place -- namely, that thinking is capable of much more than merely grasping thoughts. As articulated in the Grundlagen and refined in the Grundgesetze and elsewhere, Frege's logicism seems to involve: first, the idea that thinking itself (perhaps as 'reason') can 'give' itself purely logical contents, in the sense that it can provide 'elucidations [Erläuterungen]' of the basic concepts of logic (i.e., what are expressed by the 'basic signs [Urzeichen]' of a logical notation); second, the idea that thinking itself can recognize ('judge') the truth of such contents; and third, the idea that thinking by itself can prove the truth of thoughts formed on the basis of these basic logical concepts, as the proofs at issue in logic rest solely on the basic and 'most universal' laws which are valid in 'all domains of thinking' (Frege 1897: 139).

It is precisely in its expansion of the epistemic power of thinking along these lines that Frege's Erkenntnistheorie becomes the most controversial, when viewed from the perspective of post-Kantianism. Frege's commitment to the sufficiency of the power of thinking to generate genuine (logical, arithmetical) knowledge on its own that places him (by his own lights) in such stark opposition to the Kantian tradition's commitment to the necessity of combining thinking with some other sort of mental activity (viz. intuiting) for any cognition to be possible. Garavaso and Vassallo's discussion of the epistemic significance of thinking in Chapter 4, however, remains at arms' length from any prolonged or substantive engagement with the Kantian background framing the core commitments of Frege's logicism, and so does not go into any detail on Frege's revisionary account of how thinking (or 'reason') can 'give' itself logical and arithmetical content and also autonomously establish (justify, prove) truths via these contents on the basis of its own laws alone. Yet it is only by accounting for the more robust epistemic productivity that Frege means to ascribe to thinking, beyond its receptivity in grasping, that we can hope to take the full measure of Frege's ambitious and revolutionary claim for the epistemic significance of thinking itself: thinking on its own is an independent, self-sufficient 'source' of content (thoughts), judgment, truth, justification, proof, and ultimately knowledge as well; thinking itself is a genuine Erkenntnisquelle, in the language of the late manuscript.

I hope the foregoing has helped to make clear, first, that the heart of Garavaso and Vassallo's book (Chapters 3-4) identifies an important nest of topics which deserve further historical and conceptual exploration, topics which are of deep interest to those working in the history of analytic philosophy and the history of post-Kantian philosophy of mental acts more broadly.[6] I hope also, however, to have brought out the extent to which Garavaso and Vassallo leave a good deal more work to be done on these fronts, if we are to hope to fully articulate and critically assess Frege's theses concerning the epistemic significance of thinking itself.


Dummett, Michael. 1981. The Interpretation of Frege's Philosophy. Harvard.

Frege, Gottlob. 1897. 'Logik', in Nachgelassene Schriften, eds. H. Hermes et al. Meiner, 1969: 137-63.

Frege, Gottlob. 1918. 'Der Gedanke'. Beiträge zur Philosophie des deutschen Idealismus. I. Band (1918/19), S. 58-77.

Frege, Gottlob. 1924-5. 'Erkenntnisquellen der Mathematik und der mathematischen Naturwissenschaften', in Nachgelassene Schriften, eds. H. Hermes et al. Meiner, 1969: 286-94.

Heis, Jeremy. 2008. 'Review of The Origins of Analytic Philosophy: Kant and Frege, by Delbert Reed'. Notre Dame Philosophical Reviews, September 10.

Tolley, Clinton. 2011. 'Frege's Elucidatory Holism'. Inquiry, 54.3: 226-51.


[1] While acknowledging that 'Dummett's work has already been widely criticized' (8), and while citing (though do not discussing) various act-theoretical interpreters.

[2] The centrality of Kantian influences is acknowledged even by Dummett, who is otherwise sharply critical of attempts (e.g., Sluga's) to make Frege into a full-blown transcendental idealist.

[3] Indeed, Garavaso and Vassallo ultimately concede as much, noting that what 'Frege calls pure thinking' is 'the proper object of the logicians' and philosophers' reflection' (13; compare 102).

[4] Moreover, nothing prohibits a mind which is purely non-psychological, in the sense of having no representations, from engaging with thoughts which are not 'purely logical', in the sense of being about non-logical subject-matter (e.g., the divine mind thinking thoughts about the created world).

[5] Frege then claims that in logical investigations, the relevant 'mixing' in question is overcome by humans: logic has the task of 'separating out purely what is logical [das Logische rein herauszusondern]', with the result being precisely that 'we consciously [bewusst] distinguish the logical' from what else is in our minds (Frege 1897: 154; my ital.) -- which again puts pressure on Garavaso and Vassallo's claim that humans cannot ever come to engage in purely logical thinking.

[6] Let me also point readers to Garavaso and Vassallo's helpful discussion of the varieties of anti-psychologism present in Frege's work (Chapter 2), and their spirited defense (in Chapter 5) of the claims, first, that, for Frege, apprehending a thought 'requires apprehending (grasping) each constituent', and that this is 'dependent on the particular linguistic form used to express the thought'; and, second, that the 'parts' of the thought so apprehended are themselves 'relative to the sentence expressing the thought' (99; my ital.).