Frege's Logic

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Danielle Macbeth, Frege's Logic, Harvard University Press, 2005, xii+206pp, $45.00, ISBN 0674017072

Reviewed by Sanford Shieh, Wesleyan University


As MacBeth puts it in the Preface, her aim in this book is “to develop a novel reading of Frege’s logical language Begriffsschrift and to defend that reading textually as a reading of Frege’s writings” (vii). She rejects the widespread assumption that Frege is (one of) the discoverer(s) of modern polyadic quantificational logic, by arguing “that Frege’s logical language … can … be read as … radically different” from “a language of quantificational logic” (vii). Although MacBeth doesn’t put it in this way, on her alternative reading Frege was engaged in an expressivist and inferentialist project similar in spirit to the one recently articulated by Robert Brandom. Since it’s always philosophically salutary to be made aware of and to re-examine one’s fundamental assumptions, it is useful for anyone interested in Frege’s views, or in the nature of logic, to confront MacBeth’s challenge to the orthodoxy even if, like me, one finds it not altogether clear what MacBeth’s case amounts to, and even if what one can understand of it is ultimately unpersuasive.

I will first give an outline of MacBeth’s interpretation, omitting details that I don’t take to contribute to the main argument, and then examine more closely her principal exegetical theses.

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