Frege’s Detour: An Essay on Meaning, Reference, and Truth

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John Perry, Frege’s Detour: An Essay on Meaning, Reference, and Truth, Oxford University Press, 2019, 148pp., $40.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780198812821.

Reviewed by Scott Soames, University of Southern California


In this book, John Perry connects his early study of Frege to current views widely seen as anti-Fregean. He argues that, but for a key Fregean misstep, the gap between Frege and direct-reference theorists needn't have been so great. The misstep is on display in the opening passage of "On Sense and Reference", where Frege gives a paradoxical argument that identity, expressed by '=', can relate neither objects or names. It can't relate objects, since if it did, then, when a is b, a's being b would be a's being a and knowing the latter would be knowing the former, which it isn't. Next we are told that if names are distinguished merely by orthographic form, ignoring how they designate, then identity can't be a relation between names, because to learn that two such forms are coreferential isn't to acquire the worldly knowledge we typically gain from learning that a = b. Frege then introduces modes of presentation as senses, seemingly inviting us to think that '=' does express a relation between names, after all, provided they are individuated in part by their senses. Since using such names requires recognizing conditions they impose on their referents, learning they are coreferential would, it seems, provide us with worldly information.

This is, of course, nonsense; identity relates objects. If the argument to the contrary suggested by Frege's text were correct, it could be used to show that no relations knowable a priori to be universally reflexive actually relate objects. Since open formulas, e.g., '~(Fx & Gy)', expressing such relations can be formed from predicates expressing properties knowable a priori not to be jointly satisfiable, one would be hard pressed to find any predicates expressing properties of objects. In short, Frege's discussion of identity sentences was inadvertent misdirection. Fortunately, however, that wasn't the end of the story. There are better arguments, which don't put any special weight on identity, for distinguishing the senses of at least some expressions from their referents.[1]

How -- given those arguments and what we may suppose to be the different senses of 'Hesperus' and 'Phosphorus' -- are the different truth conditions of the Fregean thoughts that Hesperus = Phosphorus and that Hesperus = Hesperus related to the fact that each merely predicates identity of Venus, Venus? The thoughts differ despite predicating the same relation of the same pair, because Fregean predication of a relation R is really predication of the relation determining objects instantiating R of modes of presentation of those objects.[2] This odd idea, that we never directly predicate properties of objects, becomes stranger still when we realize that Fregean thoughts are objects. To predicate identity of them is to predicate determining identical thoughts of modes presenting them. If these modes of presentation are expressed by clauses G ⌈that S⌉ and ⌈that T⌉, they are "indirect senses" of S and T, generating Frege's worrisome hierarchy.

Needless to say, Perry doesn't go down Frege's road. Nor are the defects noted here his main concern. His main worry is that, instead of merely adding senses, Frege abandoned his Begriffsschrift interpretive framework, in which singular terms denote objects, predicates denote properties, and quantifiers denote properties of properties. Because sentences are structured complexes of these expressions, they denote complexes of objects (or properties) bearing properties. In the Begriffsschrift, these complexes, called 'circumstances', were taken to be the conceptual contents of sentences.

In chapters 3-6, Perry discusses the general problem of which the identity problem is an instance: sentences denoting the same circumstance may have different cognitive contents. Noticing this, Frege introduced senses incorporating modes of presentation. Perry agrees that such modes are needed, but he faults Frege for not providing proper modes of presentation for predicates and sentences. Frege did provide senses for names incorporating ways of cognizing objects we use them to denote. Had he treated predicates and sentences similarly, their senses would have been ways of cognizing properties predicates denote and ways we conceive of the circumstances we use sentences to talk about. But Frege didn't do that. Instead he took predicates to denote functions from objects to sentential denotations -- namely, the True and the False.

Though Perry accepts modes of presentation, he doesn't take them to be linguistic meanings or semantic contents. Semantic contents of names and predicates are objects and properties; semantic contents of sentences are circumstances. Modes of presentation are ways of identifying objects that names designate, ways of cognizing circumstances we use sentences to think about (not ways of cognizing the True/False), and ways of cognizing properties we predicate of objects or other properties (not extensional functions). Since the modes of presentation associated with an expression vary from agent to agent and context to context, they are not semantically encoded contents, but cognitive entities involved in pragmatic language use.

One of Perry's points involves names, like 'Hesperus'. Recall a line from "On Sense and Reference":

If the sign "a" is distinguished from the sign "b" only as object (here by means of its shape), not as a sign (i.e., not by the manner in which it designates), the cognitive value of a=a becomes essentially equal to that of a=b, provided that a=b is true.[3]

This, as Perry emphasizes, is misleading. If we have heard others say "Hesperus is sometimes visible in the evening" and "Phosphorus is a moonless planet," then if someone we trust says "Hesperus = Phosphorus," we may infer that a moonless planet is sometimes visible in the evening -- even if we don't associate any independent reference-determining sense with either name. To do so, we must know that names denote objects and sentences containing them are true iff the objects have the properties our sentences represent them as having. Although this requires identifying those objects and properties, it doesn't require associating independent reference-determining senses with expressions denoting them.

One of Perry's chief points is that a truth-conditional theory of the general sort Frege had at his disposal offers semantic hooks on which to hang informative content. Such a theory tells us that a use of 'H = P' is true iff (i) there are senses SH, SP, and S= (of 'H', 'P', and '='), (ii) objects oH and oP denoted by 'H' and 'P' and cognized via SH and SP, (iii) a relation R denoted by '=' and cognized via S=, such that (iv) oH stands in R to oP, and hence (v) 'H = P' is true. An agent who knows this and intends to use 'H = P' in accord with its meaning can use it to predicate identity of Venus and Venus, while including being sometimes visible in the evening in SH, and being moonless in SP. By applying similar reasoning to 'H = H' we distinguish the cognitively significant 'H = P' from the cognitively insignificant 'H = H'.

If you wonder how SH can determine Venus without uniquely describing it, you are thinking of determining in the wrong way. One who uses 'Hesperus' with the intention to pick out whatever it denotes in one's linguistic reference group -- e.g., the origin of a historical chain of reference transmission -- typically refers to Venus. Since, in our example, one has already included being sometimes visible in the evening in one's mental 'Hesperus' file, sentences containing the name carry that information. Although it isn't part of linguistic meaning, it is reflected in one's beliefs. In contexts in which speaker-hearers jointly presuppose that they possess this information, it may also be reflected in their assertions.[4] Perry's senses of names -- he calls them 'ideas' -- are cognitive entities through which agents think about things in systematic ways that allow then to coordinate their beliefs, desires, and actions.

The resulting semantic-pragmatic framework is plausibly productive. However, there are worries. In chapter 5 Perry distinguishes semantically determined circumstances from pragmatically determined thoughts connected with uses of natural language sentences. Circumstances are complexes of objects (denoted by singular terms) and properties (denoted by predicates); they don't include modes of presentations of objects and properties occurring in them. Given this, we may ask whether complex Fregean singular terms like '210,' 'the capital of Germany', and 'the NFL's most successful quarterback' remain singular terms in Perry's reconstruction. If they do, then the (a), (b) pairs must stand for (and so be used to talk about) the same circumstances.

1a. 210 = 1024
  b. 1024 = 1024

2a. The capital of Honduras = Tegucigalpa
  b. Tegucigalpa = Tegucigalpa

3a. Tom Brady = The NFL's most successful quarterback
  b. Tom Brady = Tom Brady

Do they? To figure this out we must know what work Perry wants denoting the same circumstance to do. He illustrates that work with an example involving Fred, who associates 'Aristotle' with the sense the student of Plato and teacher of Alexander, and Ethel, who associates 'Aristotle' with the one who taught Alexander and was born in Stagira.

if Fred says, "Aristotle likes syllogisms" he says something true . . . If Ethel says the same words, she says something different that is also true . . . They express different true thoughts with the same sentence [despite associating it with different senses]. (p. 65)

Maybe. Fred and Ethel do think different pragmatically enriched thoughts. But do they say different things? They each say of Aristotle that he likes syllogisms. Do they also say/assert/communicate different things? Perhaps, if it's common knowledge how each thinks of Aristotle. But that need not be so. Perry continues:

Why do we think . . . that there is a clear way in which Fred and Ethel agree? . . . they are talking about the same person . . . and predicating the same property of him. That is, they are agreeing about circumstances, not Thoughts.

Suppose they disagree. Fred does not think anyone could actually like syllogisms . . . [so he] says "Aristotle did not like syllogisms." It seems Ethel could truthfully say, "You said that Aristotle did not like syllogisms, I say that he did like syllogisms, so we disagree". . . It seems that . . . [in ordinary conversations and reports about them] something like circumstances are recognized. When we communicate information the information may be expressed in different forms, involving different sentences and different Thoughts, as it [the information] gets passed from agent to agent. The circumstance gets at what is passed along; [at] each step the same objects and properties are involved, but not necessarily the same ways of thinking about them. And it is circumstances, not Thoughts that get at what Fred and Ethel disagree about. (pp. 65-6)

All these points about agreement and disagreement could be made with asserted and believed singular propositions taking the place of circumstances denoted. It's not clear from Perry's discussion how the two are related. Finding out requires figuring out what (attributive) uses of complex singular terms contribute to his circumstances. When the enterprising reader constructs her own Fred-Ethel dialogs involving (1ab-3ab), she will discover that, just as the complex singular terms '210', 'the capital of Germany', and 'the NFL's most successful quarterback' typically don't contribute their denotations to the propositions asserted or communicated by conversational uses of (1a-3a), so they had better not contribute their denotations to Perry's circumstances, either. Perhaps for this reason, he sketches a view Frege could have adopted, but didn't. According to it, the circumstance denoted by ⌈the F is G⌉ is one in which being uniquely F and being G, fall under being jointly instantiated.[5] Although generalizing this idea to include terms like '210' would distinguish the circumstances denoted by (a) and (b) in (1-3), it would do so by reanalyzing complex singular terms out of existence. This is potentially problematic. Since there seem to be possible languages that have such terms, no system of semantic interpretation should rule them out (as Russell's infamous Gray's Elegy argument in "On Denoting" did).[6] This may be a worry if Perry's key notion of a circumstance denoted by a sentence turns out to require it.

In chapters 6-8, Perry indicates that circumstances are related to earlier notions of situations found in Barwise and Perry. Thus, it's not surprising that my worry about complex singular terms in his current system is related to problems with treatments of attributive uses of definite descriptions in those works.[7] There, propositions said to be expressed by uses of sentences containing such descriptions were pairs consisting of a situation/circumstance type plus an actual situation referred to by the agent using the sentence. That idea is absent from Frege's Detour, where circumstances themselves appear to be things believed and asserted. This is a natural choice if complex singular terms are excluded, and circumstances with objects as constituents are thought of as singular propositions.

However, this choice leads to another Russellian worry. It is one thing to identify true propositions one believes with circumstances, thought of as constituents of reality consisting of objects bearing properties and standing in relations. But what should false propositions be -- unreal circumstances consisting of objects plus properties they don't bear or relations they don't stand in? It was precisely this implausibility that led Russell to reject propositions and adopt his ill-fated "the multiple relations theory of the attitudes."[8] Thus, it is striking that Perry accepts that Russellian theory as a "plausible and illuminating view" (p. 112). Unfortunately, Perry neither addresses the crippling shortcomings of Russell's failed theory, articulates the illuminating insight behind it, nor identifies the cognitive entities, which, when seen as propositions, can be used to preserve Russell's brilliant insight.[9]

What led Russell to reject propositions as complexes of objects and properties which, independent of us, represent the world as being certain ways (and so have truth conditions) was the impossibility of "unifying" their constituents into genuinely representational structures. His insight was that it is the mind of the agent that unifies them. What he didn't see is that this leads not to the elimination of propositions as that which we believe, assume, assert, deny, or doubt, but to the recognition of propositions as cognitive acts or operations. When this is done, the functions needed to accommodate complex singular terms can easily be accommodated as among the cognitive operations that define some propositions.[10]

Perry's embrace of Russell is partly similar to my own and partly different. It is similar in that he takes beliefs and other attitudes to be cognitive states or events with truth conditions; it is different in failing to take what is believed, asserted, or doubted to itself be cognitive. This is related to what seems to me to be a failure to take full advantage of his highly informative observations in chapter 9 concerning the relationship of first-person and present-tense modes of presentation to more primitive modes of presentation, and of self-knowledge. When propositions are recognized as complex cognitive acts or operations, these too can be included in the sub acts or operations defining them.[11]


Barwise, Jon and John Perry. 1983. Situations and Attitudes, Cambridge MA: MIT Press.

Barwise, Jon and John Perry. 1985. "Shifting Situations and Shaken Attitudes," Linguistics and Philosophy 8:105-61.

Frege, Gottlob. 1967 (1879). Begriffsschrift, trans. by S. Bauer-Mengelberg, in Van Heijenoort, 1-82.

Frege, Gottlob. 1960 (1892). "On Sense and Reference," trans. by Max Black, in Geach and Black, Translations from the Philosophical Writings of Gottlob Frege, Oxford: Basil Blackwell. 56-78.

King, J. C., Scott Soames, Jeff Speaks. 2014. New Thinking about Propositions, Oxford: Oxford University Press.

Russell, Bertrand. 1905. "On Denoting," Mind 14:479-93

Russell, Bertrand. 1910. "On the Nature of Truth and Falsehood," in Russell, Philosophical Essays. London: Allen Unwin.

Russell, Bertrand. 1997 (1912). The Problems of Philosophy, New York and Oxford: Oxford University Press.

Soames, Scott. 2009 (1986). "Incomplete Definite Descriptions," Philosophical Essays, Vol. 1, Princeton and Oxford: Princeton University Press, 329-59.

Soames, Scott. 2010. What is Meaning?, Princeton and Oxford: Princeton University Press.

Soames, Scott. 2014. The Analytic Tradition in Philosophy, Vol. 1, Princeton and Oxford: Princeton University Press.

Soames, Scott. 2015. Rethinking Language, Mind, and Meaning, Princeton and Oxford: Princeton University Press.

[1] Soames (2014) section 4 of chapter 2.

[2] Soames (2014) pp. 95-6 and King, Soames, and Speaks pp. 119-24.

[3] Frege (1892), reprinted in Geach and Black (1960), p. 57.

[4] 'Hesperus' and 'Phosphorus' are unusual Millian names competent uses of which typically presuppose that parties to the communication take the former to refer to something visible in the evening and the latter to refer to something visible in the morning. Chapter 4 of Soames (2015) extracts broad pragmatic lessons from this for Millian semantic theories.

[5] Ibid. p. 61. This is essentially quantification -- a variant of the view that involves predicating the property being true of something uniquely F of the property being G.

[6] Chapter 8, section 2.3 of Soames (2014).

[7] See Soames (2009 [1986]).

[8] Russell (1910, chapter 12 of 1997 [1912]).

[9] See chapter 9, sections 3-5 of Soames (2014).

[10] See chapters 4-6 of Soames (2010) and chapter 2 of Soames (2015).

[11] See chapters 3-5 of Soames (2015).