French Hegel: From Surrealism to Postmodernism

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Baugh, Bruce, French Hegel: From Surrealism to Postmodernism, Routledge, 2003, 256pp, $26.95 (pbk), ISBN 041596587X.

Reviewed by Robert Bernasconi, University of Memphis


Bruce Baugh has written an extraordinarily useful study of the French reception of the Hegelian unhappy consciousness, but to appreciate French Hegel, it is important to understand what it does and does not accomplish. Although the book does not contribute much to our understanding of Hegel, and is not intended to do so, it presents itself as a corrective of current views about Hegel’s role in twentieth century philosophy. This too is not the book’s strength. Read in isolation, French Hegel would probably be even more misleading than the accounts it seek to correct, because we hear almost nothing about the master-slave dialectic and important figures like Alexandre Kojève are not given the prominent place that their impact warrants. Where the book excels is as a significant contribution to the ongoing effort to gain a historical perspective on twentieth-century French philosophy. The title, French Hegel, is probably the worst thing about the book, because it leads the reader to expect an entirely different book, a book that would demonstrate and assess Hegel’s impact on French philosophy during the last eighty years. Certainly this is how the book starts out, with a brief but fascinating chapter on the French reception of Hegel in the 1920s, but the intellectual history approach is soon abandoned. Instead, what we find is a study of some of the most prominent French thinkers of the last century that highlights certain recurrent themes, most notably, the experience of a self divided against itself. The result is a book that all scholars of twentieth-century French thought will enjoy as they cannot fail to be impressed by Baugh’s detailed knowledge of the many figures discussed. This book is an invaluable resource, less by virtue of the author’s thesis than by his enviable knowledge of important details of the history of recent French thought.

If Baugh had wanted to write a corrective to the established story about the role of the master-slave dialectic on French reading of Hegel, which is certainly still the dominant story among scholars, we would have needed to hear more about that story in the course of this book. If he had wanted to persuade us that Hegel’s thought was important to an understanding of the French philosophers discussed here, then he would have needed to tell us more about what Hegel actually says. One would love to have seen from Baugh some evidence that he has as rich a knowledge of Hegel as he has of some of the hitherto forgotten French scholars of Hegel of the first part of the twentieth century, like Victor Delbos and Victor Basch. Unfortunately, Baugh does not show the French thinkers struggling over how to read and how to respond to Hegel, except in his remarks on Sartre’s Notebooks for an Ethics, so we are left with the largely false impression that they were much less concerned about Hegel than about each other.

Baugh’s contention that unhappy consciousness and not the master-slave dialectic is the central reference point for French readers of Hegel is not to be understood as referring to those few pages at the end of the fourth chapter of the Phenomenology of Spirit that describe what Hegel calls “unhappy consciousness.” What Baugh has in mind under that title is that experience of a self divided against itself that Jean Wahl, in his influential book from 1929. Le Malheur de la conscience dans la Philosophie de Hegel, took to be driving theme of Hegel’s Phenomonology of Spirit. It is therefore Wahl’s account of Hegel’s unhappy consciousness that organizes the French Hegel, and Baugh makes a powerful case not just for Wahl’s significance in this respect but much else besides. The idea of the human being as a being “who is what he is not and is not what he is” is not originally Sartre’s, although it is often associated with him, nor even Kojève’s, although he uses the phrase, but Wahl’s. Similarly the phrase “transcendental empiricism” was Wahl’s before it belonged to Deleuze. Baugh thus makes a strong case for Wahl’s significance and the importance of his Hegel book in particular, and yet one is left with a stronger sense of Wahl’s influence than his argument, still less the plausibility of his reading of Hegel. This is symptomatic of the book as a whole. What Baugh does really well is draw connections between the various French philosophers he discusses: he is particularly good at placing Sartre in a larger context.

The dominant thesis and most controversial aspect of the book will be the claim that we have now reached “the end of the career of the unhappy consciousness as an important theme of French philosophy” (177). According to Baugh, Derrida was “the last great expositor of Wahl’s theme of déchirement” and that not only this theme but also Hegelianism in general was decisively left behind by Deleuze and Foucault working in tandem. However, although Baugh makes a spirited effort to characterize the difference between Deleuze’s différence and Derrida’s différance, it is far from clear that that is what will prove decisive. If Baugh had been more attentive to the questions and experiences that gave the idea of a self divided against itself such prominence, it might not have been so easy to announce its disappearance from the scene. Furthermore, even if that were the case, would that mean the end of Hegel? Baugh seems to concede in the concluding chapter of French Hegel that just as the French invented a new Hegel in the aftermath of the First World War to meet that context, one might yet see another new French Hegel before long.

Baugh’s book will be of great value to scholars particularly for his acknowledgment of Jean Wahl’s importance for the last seventy-five years of French philosophy. He might have gone on and shown the full significance of the work of Jean Hyppolite as it relates to the post-war period. Had he done so, the advent of Deleuze would have appeared less surprising. However, in general Baugh succeeds in tying together various strands of French philosophical thought in ways that arise from extensive reading and deep reflection on the issues. He gives us a rare glimpse into the richness of twentieth-century French philosophy, a sense of how much has been lost by our tendency to focus on a few major figures at the expense of the rest, and some insight into the misunderstandings that have arisen because of that narrow focus. This is a book for scholars, not one I would recommend to the uninitiated, who might easily be misled, if they did not already have a good understanding of the themes already discussed. Nevertheless scholars will cherish their copies of this book for the fund of information and insight that it puts at their disposal: Bruce Baugh has put us in his debt.