French Philosophy: 1572-1675

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Desmond M. Clarke, French Philosophy: 1572-1675, Oxford University Press, 2016, 275pp., $50.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780198749578.

Reviewed by Roger Ariew, University of South Florida


Desmond Clarke recently passed away. He was a major Cartesian scholar, a professor of Philosophy at University College Cork, Ireland, and editor and translator of a number of primary works, from Descartes' Meditations and Discourse on Method to seventeenth century texts on the equality of the sexes (by François Poulain de la Barre, Marie le Jars de Gournay, and Anna Maria van Schurman). But he is best known for a quartet of important monographs on Descartes and the Cartesians: Descartes' Philosophy of Science (1982), Occult Powers and Hypotheses: Cartesian Natural Philosophy Under Louis XIV (1989), Descartes's Theory of Mind (2003), and Descartes: A Biography (2005). His continued contributions to the history of early modern philosophy will be missed, as will his sharp intellect and his good-natured conversation.

Clarke's most recent work is part of a series, The Oxford History of Philosophy, with titles that focus on narratives about philosophy as situated in specific times and places or nationalities (Philosophy in Early Modern India 1450-1700, French Philosophy since 1960, British Philosophy in the Seventeenth Century, etc.). This emphasis causes Clarke to set a fairly arbitrary time and place for his narrative, something of which he is clearly aware. What constitutes French philosophy at a time when the learned Western world still used Latin as its universal language? What counts as French philosophy? Does one exclude from this history someone like Hobbes, an Englishman, who spent a fair amount of his time in France? Someone like Descartes, a Frenchman, who lived most of his adult life in the Netherlands? What about the many French or francophone Protestants in Geneva? And the numerous other philosophers living in neighboring countries, such as Libertus Fromondus, Nicholas Steno, van Schurman, or even Leibniz and Spinoza? Clarke decides to include some of these, but for reasons that seem more pragmatic than principled (as would be expected). The delimiting years for Clarke's narrative are awkward as well: 1572 happens to be the date of the St. Bartholomew massacre, while 1675 is given as an end date in order to demarcate the volume from another planned volume on Cartesian philosophy after the death of Descartes (though many Cartesian works were written before 1675).

Moreover, Clarke excludes French Scholastics from his volume because, as he asserts: "Scholastic teachers and textbook authors . . . were generally as unoriginal as their early modern critics alleged. . . . with one minor exception, none of the contributors to original modern thought in this period was employed as a philosophy professor" (p. xii). These statements are mostly false, of course. Scholastic teachers were not as unoriginal as Clarke alleges (or considered to be so universally) and more of those whom Clarke calls contributors to "original modern thought" were in fact philosophy teachers (including Pierre Gassendi and Marin Mersenne, Eustachius a Sancto Paulo and Francisco Sanchez) than he indicates, but for structural social reasons, they did not remain teachers and evolved to be lawyers, physicians, or theologians, whether in or out of academia. In any case, it is difficult to think that originality, as opposed to, let us say, influence, should be the appropriate criterion of inclusion in a contextual history of philosophy. Regardless of his initial pronouncements, Clarke examines the scholastic theory of mind (of Eustachius a Sancto Paulo) before talking about Descartes on mind; he spills over his claimed restrictions on numerous occasions, needing to mention non-French thinkers such as Nicolaus Copernicus, Johannes Kepler, Hobbes, and van Schurman.

The tone of the volume, as part of the Oxford History of Philosophy, colors the narrative as well, in that it is not driven by an over-arching thesis: it is not about any particular issue. Clarke divides his subject into eight chapters of approximately thirty pages each on diverse topics; after an introductory essay about the history of the period and one on skepticism, he produces, in classic seventeenth-century textbook fashion, essays on faith and reason, natural philosophy, mind, ethics, and political philosophy, ending with a novel chapter on the equality of the sexes. These essays cover much ground. The introductory chapter called Philosophy in Context discusses the theological politics and religious context of early modern France, together with the teaching of philosophy, censorship practices, and the rise of academies. It is all very broad and interesting, but feels a bit too concise. For example, Théophraste Renaudot gets a single sentence about offering clinics to the poor, founding a weekly newspaper, and providing a venue for conferences at the Bureau d'Adresse. A second sentence talks about the demise of Renaudot's projects after the death of his patron Richelieu.

The second chapter goes over ground previously well-trodden by Richard Popkin, on skepticism, with treatments of the works of Michel de Montaigne, Pierre Charron, Sanchez, Gassendi, François de La Mothe Le Vayer, Mersenne, Jean de Silhon, and Descartes. The third chapter on faith and reason discusses the views of major figures such as Hobbes, Descartes, and Gassendi, on issues concerning the status of religious belief, interpreting biblical texts, conceiving God, and accounting for the sacrament of the Eucharist, ending up with Blaise Pascal on faith. Descartes and Gassendi's views make up the core of the next two chapters on natural philosophy and the human mind. The same two thinkers are also treated in the chapter on ethics, but the discussion spans a number of interesting minor figures as well: the Stoic Guillaume du Vair, together with some anti-Stoics, the moralist Martin Cureau de la Chambre, and the ever eclectic Pascal, among others. Similarly fine-grained are the last two chapters, on political philosophy and on the equality of the sexes. In the former essay one is treated to Jean Bodin's view of absolute sovereignty, François Hotman and Théodore de Bèze's French Protestant criticism of it, as well as the restatement of the criticism in the anonymous Vindiciae contra Tyrannos. The last essay details views about the equality of the sexes, from de Gournay, van Schurman, and Poulain de la Barre.

Descartes, of course, looms large in most of the chapters. Clarke presents a consistent, but non-standard interpretation of his views. He describes Descartes as primarily a natural philosopher, a limited hypothetical-deductivist (limited because "intelligibility" is used as a criterion for selecting hypotheses); but he concedes there is evidence that Descartes thinks "it might have been possible to provide a metaphysical foundation for natural philosophy that would compensate for the uncertainty that results from a hypothetical starting point" (p. 105). At times Clarke seems to wish that Descartes had not written his metaphysical works, the Meditations and Principles, Part I. He describes Descartes' endeavors "to provide a foundation for the kind of metaphysical certainty that he aimed to realize" as manifestly weak. He seems to favor the "interpretation that his supportive Dutch colleague, Henricus Regius, offered. . . . Regius suggested that Descartes did not believe the metaphysical arguments that he had presented in the Meditations" (p. 62). Clarke concludes that "whether or not Descartes's engagement with metaphysics was genuine or successful, however, is marginal to the success of his life's work, as Regius suggested" (p. 63). One can find accounts of Descartes' work throughout the volume that are consistent with that perspective, whether with respect to his views on immortality, the mind, freedom and will, ethics or the difference between humans and animals.

While Clarke's wide-ranging scholarship is evident throughout the work, the nature of the work still leaves something to be desired, in that it does not allow lengthy expositions or disparate interpretations to be displayed and analyzed. I limit myself to a single example that suggests that the brevity of some discussions can produce significant distortions of the philosophical views referred to. The example concerns Clarke's formulation of Charron's skepticism. According to Clarke, Charron

published a lengthy defense of the Catholic faith in the Three Truths (1594). The three truths in question were (i) 'that there is a religion admissible by all . . . against atheists and the irreligious'; (ii) that 'of all religions, Christianity is the best, against all miscreants, gentiles, Jews and Mahometans'; and (iii) that among the various forms of Christianity, 'the Roman Catholic form is the best, against all heretics and schismatics' (pp. 39-40).

These are in fact the titles of the three books that comprise Charron's Three Truths. Clarke concludes from this: "Thus, Charron was not at all doubtful about the orthodoxy or truth of his own religious belief" (p. 40). Clarke continues with a discussion of Charron's more famous work, On Wisdom, dismissing it as well by characterizing one of its key passages as a "familiar but unjustified claim" (p. 40). Despite the unimpeachable evidence with which we are provided, Clarke's unsympathetic readings of Charron simply miss the mark.

Charron's Three Truths is primarily a critique of Philippe de Mornay's Traité de l'Eglise. In that treatise de Mornay distinguishes pure and impure forms of Christianity, the pure forms being based upon whether the Word of God is preached simply and sacraments administered properly; thus the Sacred Scriptures allow one to discern between the pure and impure forms of Christianity. On the other hand, Roman Catholicism, according to de Mornay, maintains many damnable heresies, and persecutes and excommunicates those who desire to redress them. De Mornay concludes that the Pope is the Anti-Christ, something he thinks is based on the Word of God. Charron denies de Mornay's theses in the third of his three truths. This is the largest book of the Three Truths, even in its first edition, and it grew even larger after the publication of an anonymous reply to Charron (probably by de Mornay) with Charron's replies to the reply. Charron's general counter-argument fits perfectly within the frame provided by early modern French Catholic skepticism. Charron, as a skeptic, inverts de Mornay's perspective: the Church, not the Sacred Scriptures, is the ultimate and supreme judge of religion. The individual cannot be the judge of the Sacred Scriptures, because the meaning of the Scriptures is quasi-infinite without the interpretation of the Church. From Charron's point of view the schismatics are the dogmatists, since they make the individual the measure of everything.

This skeptical line of argumentation is set up by the first two books of the Three Truths. According to the first truth, the universal admissibility of religion would be based on the existence of God. But in his chapter 5, "Discourse on the knowledge of God", Charron argues that the nature and existence of God are not known to us because of our weakness and the greatness of God. God's infinity surpasses the possibility of our knowledge, since, according to Charron, to know is to define, to limit, and God is beyond all limits. As a result, the greatest philosophers and wisest theologians know God neither more nor less than the least artisan. Thus the first truth is not that God exists, which we cannot know, but that religion in itself is more useful than irreligion. In a pre-Pascalian fashion, Charron argues that believing in God is more useful than not believing anything about such things, that is, according to him, there is considerably greater profit, pleasure, and contentment in religion than in atheism. Charron is thus full of doubts about the orthodoxy and truth of his own religious belief, but tries to convince his readers that under those conditions they are better off believing that God exists, that Christianity is the true religion, and that the Catholic Church is the true church. Charron is thus a much more interesting philosopher than Clarke's few sentences would lead one to believe.

These critical remarks should not overshadow the fact that Clarke's book is a most useful account of a delimited portion of the history of philosophy. The work offers a broad exposition of large swatches of early modern French philosophy. To accomplish this task requires an author with a vast erudition and the command over an enormous quantity of disparate information, all of which were possessed by Clarke and are clearly on display throughout the work.