French Theory: How Foucault, Derrida, Deleuze, & Co. Transformed the Intellectual Life of the United States

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François Cusset, French Theory: How Foucault, Derrida, Deleuze, & Co. Transformed the Intellectual Life of the United States, Jeff Fort (tr.), University of Minnesota Press, 2008, 388pp., $24.95 (pbk), ISBN 9780816647323.

Reviewed by Ethan Kleinberg, Wesleyan University


There is a central question that provides a guiding thread through François Cusset's far ranging and intellectually challenging investigation into the reception of "French Theory" in the United States: how is it that "around the beginning of the 1980s, right when the works of Foucault, Deleuze, Lyotard, and Derrida were being put to work on American campuses and in some alternative communities as the theoretical foundation for a new type of politics, those very names were being demonized in France as the epitome of an outdated 'libidinal' and leftist type of politics"? (XVIII) His study unfolds, examining the chronological periods before and after this crucial decade, casting back to roughly 1966 and then moving forward up until 2004, in an attempt to answer this question and explain the American phenomenon he terms French Theory.

Cusset is fascinated by the simultaneous American invention and French erasure of French Theory and his investigation into the social, political, and theoretical causes of this transatlantic divergence takes the reader on a journey from the "public birth" of post-structuralism at the 1966 Johns Hopkins University conference that brought Roland Barthes, Jacques Derrida, Jacques Lacan and others to the United States (and together) for the first time, through the mutations and revisions of French Theory in the American academic, cultural, and political landscape up to our current moment. To be sure the wide range and loose chronology of the book makes it difficult to discern a clear American trajectory. But what makes the book an exciting and informative read is the details gleaned as we move from the world of advanced academics to the world of cyberpunk comics, temporary autonomous zones (an early incarnation of the internet), and post-modern architecture. In Cusset's account, French Theory was never the sole property of advanced academics but a site of shared interest for those academics and countercultural figures. It is actually the symbolic capital, the star power, of the countercultural figures that led to the rising popularity of the French theorists; this light then reflected back onto the American academics who, in turn, basked in the glow.

Thus Cusset's narrative unfolds in two ways. It tells the story of the academics who were instrumental in cultivating French Theory in American higher education and it also attempts to discern and explicate the points of contact with American counter-cultural forces. Indeed, the book is at its best when Cusset is demonstrating how the popularity of Foucault, Deleuze, Derrida and company was a heterogeneous phenomenon born of the cross-pollenization of multiple cultural forces that came to intersect on the site of American universities and colleges and in response to contemporary political events. But the time and effort spent unearthing or bemoaning the passing connections between Bob Dylan, Patti Smith, Bono, Madonna, or The Matrix films with thinkers like Deleuze, Derrida, Guattari, Virilio, and Foucault comes at the expense of a sustained engagement with the ways that American theorists such as Paul de Man, J. Hillis Miller, and others actually appropriated, incorporated and applied the theories of these French intellectuals in their work. There is little or no discussion of the role of historians or philosophers in this reception (the Society for Phenomenology and Existential Philosophy, for instance, is entirely absent) and there is virtually no textual analysis. Even the chapter on "Academic Stars" (Judith Butler, Gayatri Spivak, Stanley Fish, Edward Said, Richard Rorty, and Frederic Jameson) spends no more than five pages on any one thinker. On this level, those interested in the philosophical issues will be disappointed.

Rather than focus on the "use" of French Theory, Cusset spends the majority of his discussion of American academics focusing on the "abuse" of French Theory in fields such as Cultural Studies, Ethnic Studies, Post-colonial Studies, and literary criticism in general. According to Cusset, it was in these "niche markets" of academic culture that the "most sophisticated tools of textual analysis and the new university came to be applied to subjects as wide ranging as gangsta rap, "Harlequin" romance readers, Star Trek fans, and even the supposed 'philosophical' subtext of the Seinfeld series." (135) Here, the counter-cultural inflection bestowed upon French Theory made it appear the appropriate tool for criticism of popular culture and allowed for the work of some of the most abstruse thinkers to seem like an appropriate tool for almost any text. On Cusset's reading, despite the attraction to the critical dimensions of post-structuralist philosophy, especially for critically examining sites of knowledge, the American academics that applied this thought in teaching and research actually remained within the American utilitarian tradition. The irony is that it was "precisely because it posed a problem to American higher education, and a fortiori to the age of utilitarianism, that French theory claimed to be useful". (100) But the utility came to outstrip the critique. One of Cusset's keenest insights is presented in the section entitled the "politics of quotation" (86-89) where he articulates the ways that strategies of encapsulation created an "uprooting and reassembling" that allowed the American proponents of French Theory to legitimate or authorize their work by recourse to quotations while at the same time altering that work to fit their own (practical) intellectual or political agenda.

This rhizomatic proliferation of French Theory soon led to the sort of mutations that ultimately made the American variant unrecognizable in France and provides an answer to Cusset's central question. Cusset first makes this point in the Introduction when he discusses the controversy surrounding the French publication of Alan Sokal and Jean Bricmont's Impostures intellectuelles in 1997. The book itself is a polemic against the "jargon" and "charlatanism" of "postmodern thought" and is the outgrowth of what has come to be known as the "Sokal hoax" when in 1996, the cultural studies journal Social Text published what turned out to be a phony article by Sokal "titled 'Transgressing the Boundaries: Toward a Transformative Hermeneutics of Quantum Gravity.' A compendium of pseudo-scientific formulas and real quotations from authors (mostly French) … that calls into question the reality of the physical world". (4-6) The key point for Cusset is not in the details of the polemic but in the divergence between the French and American understanding of its targets.

French readers were able, at best, to hear only superficial echoes of the terms that loomed behind the 'affair,' and they were thus unable to decipher these terms in all their implications: cultural studies, constructionism, posthumanism, multiculturalism, canon wars, deconstruction, 'political correctness.' (5)

But, according to Cusset, this was because in America French Theory "signifies nothing other than becoming able, through rhetorical turns and lexical ruses, to make Foucault or Derrida not so much into references as into common nouns". (92)

Thus the answer to Cusset's guiding question is that while in France Foucault, Derrida, Deleuze, and company remained a disparate group of thinkers, in America they were all incorporated under the "brand name" French Theory (tellingly written in English in the French version of the book) and applied in accordance with market forces. In other words, French Theory did not exist in France and its popularity in America was the result of a new market that desired its product. This analysis requires that one accept Bill Reading's argument in The University in Ruins (1997) that liberal arts education -- and the university in general -- has undergone a profound change in its mission and identity as it has been transformed from a site designed to foster a unified national culture into a corporate-style service industry selling a vacuous and indefinable notion of "excellence." Using Reading, Cusset asserts that the shift to university-as-service-industry led to a need for increased specialization to provide specific sites of interests that would attract the student/customer and that the brand French Theory came to serve this purpose. For Cusset, this reveals both the popularity and most troubling aspects of French Theory in America where a subject like Madonna becomes the object of "serious" academic discourse, employing French Theory to do so, for the utilitarian purpose of attracting students/customers to the major or selling books. Thus fields such as Cultural Studies reveal a massive blindspot in the way they "laud the transgressive acts of rock stars" like Madonna while refusing to question the "highly marketable Madonna industry and the way her image is marketed." (135, 137) The main focus of this criticism is Cultural Studies but I think it would be fair to say that Cusset's indictment is intended for American culture in general because he believes it lacks sufficient Marxist sensibilities to engage in a sustained critique of capitalist culture. This is one place where it is apparent that the book was written for a French audience.

But the emphasis on the market driven appropriation of French Theory in America, in distinction to the summary dismissal of the same thinkers in France, also reveals the way that this book is less of a reception history and more of a sustained argument about the merits of French Theory and the ways that intellectuals on both sides of the Atlantic have squandered this precious resource. The framing question is designed to lead the reader to Cusset's conclusion that France is now in a unique position to reclaim the French theoreticians they had repudiated "without a second thought". For Cusset, the repudiation of these thinkers left France isolated and despite "the cant and the campus rituals surrounding them" the American discussions of French Theory "have been more in touch with the world and the ongoing processes of pluralization and absorption (or of exclusion and integration) than the French debates during the same period." (333) Here, Cusset's work is a call for France to wake up from its neo-liberal slumber "for in the university and beyond, French theory also embodies the hope that discourse might be able to restore life to life and provide access to an intact vital force that would be spared from the logic of the market and the prevailing cynicisms." (335) The preface to the English edition makes his message more ecumenical, but given his descriptions of the American academic environment and his emphasis on avoiding the "logic of the market and its prevailing cynicisms," it is hard to imagine that Cusset has full confidence in America's ability to overcome its capitalist blindspot and thus realize the potential of these "French theoretical texts." No, for Cusset it is France that holds the critical apparatus to engage in the strong critique of capitalist modes of production that would allow these texts to reach their full potential.

The emphasis on crafting the argument leads to a dramatic conclusion but also to some blindspots of Cusset's own. One problem has to do with the question of "mastery". On the one hand, Cusset wants to tell us that some of the most important inroads made by French Theory were through the chance encounters of students who never fully "mastered" the texts of thinkers like Derrida or Foucault. But on the other hand, this lack of mastery clearly troubles Cusset when discussing the American intellectuals who never gained sufficient "mastery" to discern the ways that "the very logic of French theoretical texts prohibits certain uses of them, uses that were often necessary, however, to their American readers in order to put their text to work." (278) In essence, there is a right way and a wrong way to use these texts and for the most part Americans read them the wrong way. Cusset does a good job describing the process of quotation and encapsulation that led to an at times superficial usage of these thinkers but he is unable to demonstrate what "mastery" of this corpus might be because he has dismissed French Theory (the very corpus in question) as an American invention. But this is where the summary dismissal of French Theory in France, at first glance a deficit, is revealed to be the secret hero of this story, like Hegel's "slave" in the Phenomenology of Spirit. It is precisely because French Theory did not have purchase in France that it was not misused and thus the French can now employ these texts correctly. Now the misguided American invention of French Theory can be replaced by a guided variant predicated on the proper (French?) use of French theoretical texts.

But I wonder whether such an argument, such a logic, is appropriate for the French theorists Cusset both investigates and lauds. One could certainly marshal any number of the French theorists in question to take issue with the emphasis on mastery and proper readings or redirect the charges of utilitarianism back at Cusset. I also question whether the American reception was as misguided as Cusset portrays and whether the French erasure was as complete. The repeated attacks on these very theorists in France would suggest otherwise (315-316). A successful argument would require a more thorough, multi-disciplinary, textually oriented investigation of the American case as well as an analysis of French cultural history that emphasizes the same types of cultural artifacts that Cusset investigates in the American field. But this is a tall order and Cusset has achieved much. His book is a wonderful addition to American and French intellectual history that will force us to reconsider the history, place, and role of French Theory on both sides of the Atlantic.