Friedrich Nietzsche and European Nihilism

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Paul van Tongeren, Friedrich Nietzsche and European Nihilism, Cambridge Scholars, 2018, 198pp., $119.95 (hbk), ISBN 9781527508804.

Reviewed by Matthew Meyer, University of Scranton


This is a solid piece of scholarship written by a seasoned expert in the field that will be essential reading for anyone grappling with Nietzsche's understanding of nihilism. The quality of the discussion rivals that found in Bernard Reginster's The Affirmation of Life: Nietzsche on Overcoming Nihilism (Harvard University Press, 2006). The book, which emerged from a series of university lectures, is also designed to introduce the problem of nihilism in Nietzsche's writings and European history more generally. In laying out this terrain, it succeeds admirably. However, one might quibble with some of the specifics of Van Tongeren's account, and so although this book is an important contribution to the scholarly conversation around Nietzsche's nihilism, there are also reasons to think the conversation needs to continue.

The book consists of five chapters, an introduction, and an epilogue. In the first chapter,  Van Tongeren provides a helpful history of nihilism until Nietzsche. He traces its history back to ancient Greek culture and follows it through Christianity, Cartesian doubt, the demonic will in Romanticism, and the emergence of nihilism in both Russian and French literature. In the second and third chapters, he delves into nihilism in Nietzsche, first looking at the "theme" of nihilism in Nietzsche's works (chapter two) and then unpacking Nietzsche's "theory" of nihilism in chapter three. In the final two chapters, we find a treatment of the role nihilism has played in the reception of Nietzsche and an inquiry into what, if anything, Nietzsche's nihilism might mean for us. There are two appendices that are extremely helpful for novice and advanced readers alike. The first has a full translation of all the texts Van Tongeren considers most relevant to the topic. The second contains a list of all the texts in Nietzsche's corpus containing variants of the term "nihili." In this way, Van Tongeren allows the reader to engage critically with the interpretation of nihilism he defends.

In chapters two and three, the book's core, Van Tongeren lays out his understanding of nihilism in Nietzsche. Chapter two has three sections. In the first, Van Tongeren presents an overview of Nietzsche's life and works, breaking his productive activity into four phases: (1) an initial period, from 1872 to 1876, which includes publications such as The Birth of Tragedy and his Untimely Meditations; (2) a second, from 1876 to 1881, which includes Human, All Too Human and Daybreak; (3) a third, from 1881 to 1887, which begins with The Gay Science and ends with On the Genealogy of Morals; (4) a final period, in 1888, during which Nietzsche writes works such as Ecce Homo and The Antichrist and eventually collapses into insanity. Although I find this periodization problematic (can Daybreak and The Gay Science really be placed in different periods given that most of the latter was originally written as an extension of the former?), it sets up nicely Van Tongeren's later discussion of nihilism. This is because most of Nietzsche's remarks about nihilism occur during the third period, which, according to Van Tongeren, marks the "apex" of Nietzsche's thought (27). This, in turn, allows Van Tongeren to argue, in the second section, that nihilism is a central feature of Nietzsche's mature (and sane) philosophy.

In the final section, Van Tongeren begins to develop an understanding of nihilism by analyzing it in relation to two other terms with which it frequently appears in Nietzsche's writings: pessimism and decadence. Van Tongeren begins by leading the reader through the changes in the meaning of pessimism that take place from The Birth of Tragedy to Nietzsche's later works. Whereas pessimism is closely connected with a metaphysical position that renders individuation itself the cause of suffering in The Birth of Tragedy (31), Van Tongeren claims that in the second period Nietzsche comes to think of pessimism differently, as something that provides "the moral and religious protection against the experience of an absurd world" (34). In the third stage, Nietzsche gives this second form of pessimism a name, "romantic pessimism," and he distinguishes it from a new form of pessimism that is not about, according to Van Tongeren, going back to the Greeks, but about moving forward (36). It is in this period, then, that pessimism gets bound up with nihilism, such that in one note Nietzsche speaks of a "development of pessimism into nihilism" (KSA 12: 9[107]).[1] The section ends with a discussion of decadence. Here, Van Tongeren argues, rightly, that decadence is not just another synonym for pessimism and nihilism. Instead, it provides a physiological and psychological explanation of why pessimism and nihilism might emerge within European culture.

Although Van Tongeren is undoubtedly right to highlight the intimate association that nihilism has with both pessimism and decadence, chapter two still leaves us without any clear sense of what nihilism is. In chapter three, "Nietzsche's 'Theory' of Nihilism," Van Tongeren begins by claiming that "Nietzsche has no systematic theory of nihilism to speak of" (42). Nevertheless, he goes to great lengths to make sense of Nietzsche's understanding of nihilism, and he begins by turning to Nietzsche's Nachlass, focusing much on the unpublished "Lenzer Heide" text. It is in Nietzsche's Nachlass that we come across something like an initial definition of a nihilist and so of nihilism: "A nihilist is someone who is of the judgment that the world as it is, ought not to be, and that the world as it ought to be, does not exist" (KSA 12: 9[60]). In my mind, this is a rather satisfying definition of nihilism, and it fits with most -- although not all (see GM I 12)[2] -- of Nietzsche's remarks about nihilism in the Genealogy, i.e., that it is a form of Buddhism (GM P 5), based on the judgment that existence is worthless (GM II 21), and associated with a will to nothingness (GM II 24 and GM III 28).

However, Nietzsche's remarks about nihilism are much more complicated than this, and Van Tongeren leaves behind this definition as he responds to and accounts for this complexity. For instance, Nietzsche differentiates between theoretical and practical nihilism (KSA 12: 5[71]) as well as active and passive nihilism (KSA 12: 9[35]). Whereas active nihilism comes from an increased power of the spirit and culminates in a violent force of destruction, passive nihilism -- represented by Buddhism -- stems from a weariness that no longer wants to attack (KSA 12: 9[35]). Van Tongeren also argues that the two types of pessimism -- romantic and Dionysian – Nietzsche identifies in section 370 of The Gay Science are actually two types of nihilism and that these two types of pessimism -- resulting from two types of suffering (poverty or overabundance) -- can manifest themselves as either forms of perpetuation or destruction. Taken together, we get four different types of nihilism that can, according to Van Tongeren, be mapped onto the history of European nihilism that unfolds in four phases. As we learn in section III.3, this history of nihilism moves from a period of unclarity about the nihilism embedded within Christianity (a form of perpetuation that emerges from poverty), through phases of clarity (a destruction from poverty) and a free spirit (a destruction from abundance), to a final period of perpetuation from abundance in which the thought of the eternal recurrence creates a catastrophe by "sifting" between the weak and the strong (See KSA 13: 11[150]).

Having developed this more complex understanding of nihilism in both synchronic and diachronic terms, Van Tongeren concludes the chapter by trying to capture the nature of nihilism for Nietzsche in a single statement. Specifically, he claims that "nihilism is (4) the conscious experience of an antagonism, that is the result of (3) the decline of (2) the protective structure that was built to hide (1) the absurdity of life and world" (100). This is a helpful statement, but it does present some problems. One concern is with the claim itself: it does not identify what the antagonism is; instead, it simply tells us how the antagonism comes to be. At the very end of the chapter, Van Tongeren seems to suggest that the antagonism is between our longing to believe in something and the knowledge that we can no longer believe it (102). But again, this is not clear. The other concern is that this summary leaves out any reference to the life and world-condemning judgment that is a key feature of a number of passages, including the Lenzer Heide text, in which Nietzsche discusses nihilism. It is one thing to recognize the absurdity of life and the world and to be conscious of how it conflicts with our desire to believe in some other world. It is another thing -- and this seems to be what Nietzsche is most concerned about -- to condemn a world so understood. The problem with Van Tongeren's understanding of nihilism is that it emphasizes the former and, at best, only implies the latter.

Getting clear about what nihilism means is important because it makes a difference in thinking about whether Nietzsche believes we can overcome it. If nihilism is essentially the view that life and the world are characterized by absurdity and meaningless suffering, then, as Van Tongeren seems to argue, there seems to be little hope, on Nietzsche's view, of overcoming nihilism. As early as The Birth of Tragedy, Nietzsche announces, via the mythical figure of Silenus, that human beings are an ephemeral race, children of chance and misery, and there are good reasons for thinking Nietzsche maintains this "tragic" view of human existence and the world throughout his productive career. However, The Birth of Tragedy also makes clear that Nietzsche wants to overcome Silenus' judgment that it is therefore best to never have been born and second best to die soon (BT 3).[3] Thus, if nihilism is essentially a negative (and condemning) value judgment about life and the world, then there are good reasons for thinking that much of Nietzsche's project is dedicated to overcoming nihilism. On the one hand, he tries to root out our need to believe in some sort of metaphysical beyond by envisaging a well-turned-out, healthy individual who is capable of grounding her own values (GS 347).[4] On the other hand, Nietzsche continues to praise the art forms associated with Dionysus that are able to transfigure human existence into something worthy of affirmation (TI "What I Owe" 5).[5] It is for these reasons that Nietzsche speaks of a "self-overcoming of nihilism" in his notes (KSA 12: 9[164]), and this is why he is excited about the prospects of an individual like Zarathustra who will be able to redeem reality and conquer "the great nausea, the will to nothingness, nihilism" (GM II 24).[6]

In chapter four, Van Tongeren rejects the idea that Nietzsche thinks we can ultimately overcome the threat of nihilism in any sort of robust way. He begins with an extended look at the role nihilism plays in Heidegger's interpretation of Nietzsche and moves on to discuss the work of Gianni Vattimo and Wolfgang Müller-Lauter. Van Tongeren then turns to the Anglophone Nietzsche reception. Here he voices his opposition to readings by Richard Schacht and Reginster that emphasize combatting or even overcoming nihilism (125). According to Van Tongeren, such interpreters "cannot do justice to the extent to which Nietzsche believes us to be caught and entangled" in nihilism (126). Although he acknowledges that Nietzsche explicitly refers to a "self-overcoming of nihilism" (126-27), Van Tongeren argues that the three appearances of this phrase in the Nachlass hardly justify the extent to which Anglophone literature has focused on the topic. In his view, such readings "limit the gravity" of the terror that Nietzsche attaches to nihilism "by positing that nihilism is only tied to a certain conception of metaphysics, the knowledge of morality, which can in principle be substituted with another one" (128).

In the final chapter, Van Tongeren asks what nihilism might mean for us and wonders why we don't seem too concerned about the threat it poses. He moves from an account of the death of God in Nietzsche's works to a discussion of how nihilism has been taken up by contemporary writers such as Michel Houellebecq (Atomised) and Juli Zeh (Gaming Instinct) and concludes with a discussion of the experimentalism Nietzsche expresses in the 1886-87 prefaces he adds to some of his earlier works. Along the way, Van Tongeren casts doubt on the humanistic alternative to the death of God and argues that nihilism has a paradoxical structure: whereas a nihilist who is still concerned about the threat of nihilism has not taken her nihilism far enough, the "true nihilist" is one who "has already moved beyond nihilism" (141). Here, Van Tongeren briefly points to literary humor as a means by which such a paradox can be expressed (142), but then ultimately returns to Nietzsche's experimentalism. In a sense, the book ends in the same way that Nietzsche ends section 346 of The Gay Science, an aphorism Van Tongeren often discusses: it ends with the idea that all roads lead to nihilism, but a nihilism that is nevertheless called into question, leaving us with individual experimentation but no general solution (153).

But is a self-referential experimentalism Nietzsche's ultimate response to the problem of nihilism? Perhaps. One has to wonder why Van Tongeren speaks so little of art and the capacity Nietzsche attributes to art to overcome the life-denying judgments that form, in my view, the core of nihilism (Van Tongeren acknowledges his neglect of art at the end of chapter four (129)). Indeed, if we turn to the very prefaces that Van Tongeren discusses in the final section, we find Nietzsche praising the Greeks, as artists, for being superficial out of profundity in a way that recalls the original argument of The Birth of Tragedy (GS P 4). We also find Nietzsche referring to Baubo, a Greek goddess known for using obscenity to produce laughter. This reference, in turn, points to the final section of the 1886 preface to The Birth of Tragedy, in which Nietzsche appeals to Zarathustra's teaching of the "this-worldly comfort" of laughter (BT ASC 7). In fact, every text that Nietzsche writes between 1885 and 1887 -- the very period Van Tongeren considers to be the apex of Nietzsche's reflections of nihilism -- ends with some mention of laughter (Z IV: "The Sign";[7] BGE 294;[8] GS 383), comedy (GM III 27; also see GM P 7), and parody (GS 382; also see GS P 1). To my mind, these references suggest that the real antidote to nihilism may be a particular kind of art, namely, Dionysian comedy. However, other than brief mentions of laughter (37) and humor (142), any substantive discussion of this sort of art is absent from Van Tongeren's otherwise thorough and informative -- albeit rather gloomy -- study of Nietzsche and European nihilism.

[1] KSA = Friedrich Nietzsche: Sämtliche Werke. Kritische Studienausgabe, eds. G. Colli and M. Montinari, 15 vols. (Berlin, New York, Munich: DTV, De Grutyer, 1999).

[2] GM = On the Genealogy of Morals, trans. W. Kaufmann (New York: Random House, 1989). Cited by essay number and section number. P = Preface.

[3] BT = The Birth of Tragedy, trans. W. Kaufmann (New York: Vintage, 1967). ASC = "Attempt at a Self-Criticism."

[4] GS = The Gay Science, trans. W. Kaufmann (New York: Vintage, 1974).

[5] TI = Twilight of the Idols. In The Portable Nietzsche, ed. and trans. Walter Kaufmann, 463-564 (New York: Viking Press, 1954).

[6] I thank Paul Loeb for drawing my attention to this passage.

[7] Z = Thus Spoke Zarathustra. In The Portable Nietzsche, ed. and trans. Walter Kaufmann, 109-439 (New York: Viking Press, 1954).

[8] BGE = Beyond Good and Evil, trans. W. Kaufmann (New York: Vintage, 1989).