Friedrich Schleiermacher: Between Enlightenment and Romanticism

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Richard Crouter, Friedrich Schleiermacher: Between Enlightenment and Romanticism, Cambridge University Press, 2005, 286pp., $80.00 (hbk), ISBN 0521805902.

Reviewed by Kristin Gjesdal, Temple University


The title of Richard Crouter's Friedrich Schleiermacher: Between Enlightenment and Romanticism places his study right in the centre of the current debate about this 19th century philosopher. Does Schleiermacher's work belong within the ebbing enlightenment movement, seeking, as it did, to bolster the critical imperatives voiced by Mendelssohn, Lessing, and Kant within a post-revolutionary Europe? Or is he, rather, a philosopher whose merit it is precisely to question the Enlightenment ideals, promoting instead a set of more romantic sensitivities and aspirations?

Since Hegel's fierce attack, in his preface to Hindrich's Die Religion im inneren Verhältnisse zur Wissenschaft (1822), against the very idea of religious feeling, Schleiermacher has typically been branded a proto-romantic, subjectivist thinker. This picture is reinforced more than a century later in Hans-Georg Gadamer's influential critique of Schleiermacher in Truth and Method (1960).

Gadamer's critique did in many ways set the course for the philosophical reception of Schleiermacher's work. On Gadamer's reading, Schleiermacher's philosophy, and in particular his theory of interpretation, emerges as little but a subjectivist intermezzo in the long-spanning tradition of hermeneutics. Gadamer's reading, however, was based on scanty philological material. Hence his student, Heinz Kimmerle set out, in the early 1970s, to show that the young Schleiermacher did indeed provide a theory that was much closer to Gadamer's philosophical hermeneutics than Gadamer himself was willing to admit. Others, such as Peter Szondi and Manfred Frank, followed a different route, claiming that Schleiermacher cannot be judged by the standards of a post-Heideggerian hermeneutics alone. Reflecting the aesthetic orientations of the Athenaeum circle, his is not an ontological but a literary theory of interpretation -- and, as such, it proves particularly fit to deal with the hermeneutic challenges posed by post-romantic, and perhaps even modernist, art and poetry.

Over the past 10 years or so, this position has been modified by the important scholarly work conducted by Wolfgang Virmond and the Schleiermacher archive in Berlin and by a number of comprehensive studies of Schleiermacher's work and intellectual commitments (such as Christian Berner's La Philosophie de Schleiermacher, Gunter Scholtz's Ethik und Hermeneutik, and Kurt Nowak's Schleiermacher: Leben, Werk und Wirkung). Worth mentioning in this context are also a number of more general efforts to erase the very notion of a non-negotiable opposition between enlightenment and romantic philosophy (Charles Larmore, Richard Eldridge, Frederick Beiser, and others).

How, then, does Richard Crouter situate himself within this landscape? Crouter's book is based on a number of essays, published in the period between 1986 and 2003. Following a three-part structure -- addressing, respectively, Schleiermacher's status as a theologian and philosopher, his work as a public intellectual, and his intellectual legacy -- Friedrich Schleiermacher: Between Enlightenment and Romanticism does not develop one overarching argument, but approaches Schleiermacher's work from a number of different directions.

Given Crouter's background in theology, he deals with issues and concerns that are specific to his field (such as Schleiermacher's importance for modern theology, the development and revisions of The Christian Faith, and the Wirkungsgeschichte of On Religion). Yet he also addresses questions of a more general, philosophical importance (such as the hermeneutic rationale of Dilthey's reading of Schleiermacher, the Hegel-Schleiermacher debate, Kierkegaard's indebtedness to Schleiermacher, and Schleiermacher's theory of language).The parts of Crouter's book that I found by far the most interesting -- but also, unfortunately, the most problematic -- are the ones that directly address Schleiermacher's philosophical position and intellectual legacy.

Chapter one, "Revisiting Dilthey on Schleiermacher and Biography," pursues the argument that "Dilthey's stress on life as relevant for thought resonates not just with Schleiermacher's theory but also with his practice" (p. 23). Dilthey's grand study, Leben Schleiermachers (1870), is the first and possibly still the most comprehensive attempt to situate Schleiermacher within his own time and Zeitgeist. The effort to rehabilitate this aspect of Dilthey's work is itself laudable. So is the call for a return to Schleiermacher and Dilthey's philologically oriented interpretation. However, Crouter backs up his call for such a return by arguing that there is a parallel between the Schleiermacher-Dilthey line in interpretation and Martin Heidegger's ontological hermeneutics. This truly is a puzzling proposal. Heidegger, to be sure, read Schleiermacher in his early period. This, admittedly, is also the time when he most directly engaged with hermeneutics and philosophy of history. Yet the fact that the young Heidegger was indeed acquainted with Schleiermacher's theological writings, and that this, as Theodore Kisiel has pointed out, did indeed leave some marks on his early thinking, is not sufficient to warrant a parallel with regard to the hermeneutic problems that Crouter addresses. In fact, the situation is rather the other way around: Heidegger's aim, in the period leading up to the publication of Being and Time, is precisely to criticize the Schleiermacher-Dilthey line on interpretation. At this point, a more plausible course of argument (possibly also one that would be more in line with Crouter's overall project) would be to emphasize the contrast between, on the one hand, Schleiermacher's and Dilthey's theories of philological-historical reconstruction, and, on the other, the young Heidegger's call for a phenomenological destruction of tradition in, say, the Augustine lectures of 1921 or the Aristotle seminar that he was teaching in Freiburg some short eighteen months later. For whereas Heidegger, in the early 1920s, calls for a direct engagement with the texts of the past, one in which their original context or meaning is completely played down, Schleiermacher and Dilthey, though in different ways, emphasize the need to pay heed to the text in its original context. Only such an emphasis on the way in which 19th century philological hermeneutics provides a promising alternative to Heidegger's more ontological orientation would help us get beyond the old Hegelian-Gadamerian image of Schleiermacher's naïve romanticism, and place him, instead, in the space between Enlightenment and romanticism.

"Kierkegaard's not so hidden debt to Schleiermacher," chapter four in Crouter's collection, addresses a number of interesting questions -- and, again, questions that are of fundamental relevance for understanding the historical development of hermeneutics, existentialism, and philosophy of religion. Crouter reconstructs the festivities marking Schleiermacher's visit to Copenhagen in 1833, as well as the Danish philosopher's interest in The Christian Faith, and he moves from here to address the possible influence Schleiermacher exerted on the young Søren Kierkegaard (an issue that is not given much attention in Joakim Garff's recent biography, Søren Aabye Kierkegaard, En biografi, (1994)). Drawing not only on Kierkegaard's scattered references to Schleiermacher, but also on his philosophical style, Crouter plausibly argues that there is much more of an affinity between the two thinkers than commonly acknowledged. But even here the philosophically minded reader is left somewhat disappointed. For while retrieving the Schleiermacher-Kierkegaard relationship, Crouter does not say much about how this fits in with or possibly alters the standard story of Kierkegaard's critique of romantic religion and philosophy in general.

In my view, the philosophically most interesting strands of Schleiermacher scholarship over the past 10-15 years have been the ones that deal with Schleiermacher's hermeneutics, aesthetics, and theory of language and translation. With the exception of Manfred Frank's influential work, references to more recent debates on Schleiermacher's philosophy seem more or less absent in Crouter's book. Nowhere is this more evident than in the chapter dealing with Schleiermacher's theory of language (chapter eight). Addressing a wider, theological readership, Crouter may be right in approaching Schleiermacher's theory of language in light of the discussion, in On Religion and the opening sections of The Christian Faith, of the relation between self-reflection and our linguistic capacities. Yet, as it is, this part of Schleiermacher's work draws heavily on Kant and Fichte (and the way in which these philosophers were received within the Athenaeum circle). Crouter's discussion would clearly have benefited from taking into account Schleiermacher's indebtedness to other thinkers of the time, but also by considering, in more detail, his discussion of language in texts such as the 1822 Dialektik. Again it seems to me that a critical rehearsal of Schleiermacher's theory of language would fit in really well with the ambition to resituate his work in the space between enlightenment and romanticism -- but that Crouter, from a philosophical point of view, does not redeem what he promises.

Although Schleiermacher's work has had something of a renaissance within the Anglophone world -- several important translations (including Crouter's own translation of On Religion) have been published over the past 10-20 years -- there are few systematic studies of his intellectual contribution. This seems even more surprising given the recent attention that has been paid to Herder and other figures belonging to this rich period in German Philosophy. In this sense, Friedrich Schleiermacher: Between Enlightenment and Romanticism fills an important gap. And if this, given Crouter's theological orientation, is a text that does not answer the most important questions a philosopher may be prone to raise with regard to Schleiermacher's work, it should still be seen as an important call for more philosophically geared studies of this so often underrated 19th century philosopher.