Friendship as Sacred Knowing: Overcoming Isolation

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Samuel Kimbriel, Friendship as Sacred Knowing: Overcoming Isolation, Oxford University Press, 2014, 224pp., $74.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199363988.

Reviewed by Russell DiSilvestro, California State University, Sacramento


The humans do not start from that direct perception of Him which we, unhappily, cannot avoid. They have never known that ghastly luminosity, that stabbing and searing glare which makes the background of permanent pain to our lives. If you look into your patient's mind when he is praying, you will not find that. If you examine the object to which he is attending, you will find that it is a composite object containing many quite ridiculous ingredients. . . . But whatever the nature of the composite object, you must keep him praying to it -- to the thing that he has made, not to the Person who has made him. . . . For if he ever comes to make the distinction, if ever he consciously directs his prayers "Not to what I think thou art but to what thou knowest thyself to be", our situation is, for the moment, desperate. Once all his thoughts and images have been flung aside or, if retained, retained with a full recognition of their merely subjective nature, and the man trusts himself to the completely real, external, invisible Presence, there with him in the room and never knowable by him as he is known by it -- why, then it is that the incalculable may occur. (C. S. Lewis, The Screwtape Letters, letter 4)

Whilst the intellect is dark, charity constitutes in itself a certain sacred knowing. (Samuel Kimbrell, Friendship as Sacred Knowing, page 159)

Samuel Kimbriel shows how certain isolating tendencies of modernity, as described by Charles Taylor, can be both understood and undone by re-tracing a better path through Plato and Aristotle, Jesus and John, Augustine and Aquinas.

The book has two parts. Part I ("Friendship and Disengagement") looks at the troubles that appear when enquiry and friendship get pulled apart or even divorced, whether in ancient philosophers like Plato, Aristotle, and Cicero, or modern thinkers since Descartes. Part II ("Friendship and Enquiry: Beyond Disengagement") contrasts this with the marriage of understanding and intimacy in a particular tradition of Christian philosophy starting with the Gospel of St. John and developing through St. Thomas Aquinas. As this structure suggests, Kimbriel recommends a remarriage.

I found this a very valuable work. The remainder of this review gives a selective summary of each chapter's contents and a pair of thoughts about the book as a whole.

Part I examines ways of life Kimbriel labels buffered (in Chapter 1) and semi-buffered (in Chapter 2). The labels come from Taylor, who describes a slow historical process of "disengagement" moving from a premodern "porous" stance in which philosophical activity accents befriending the highest things (think: love of wisdom) to a modern buffered stance in which philosophy accents certain sorts of independence and self-rule.

Chapter 1 ("Friendship and Isolation") echoes a claim at the core of Taylor's analyses: "for this age the 'meaning' or 'significance' or 'reason' of things has migrated from its prior residence in the furniture of the cosmos to reside almost exclusively within the human person" (11). The shift into such a "mind-centered" stance (gradually ascendant since Descartes) from the prior enchanted stance (as seen in Plato) is a shift (among other things) away from seeing reason as attunement or participation or encounter or communion or proper involvement with order in the cosmos, and into seeing reason as "control" or "certainty" or "invulnerability" or "ability to execute certain subjectively established procedures" (15). A "buffer is created and upheld between what's interior to my individual mind/soul and what's exterior to it, and what's interior becomes more important. This buffering spills over to the social world, sometimes threatening our relational entanglements (especially with the "cosmic attunement" seen in traditional longing for relationship with God), other times domesticating or privatizing or sentimentalizing them (especially with the "interpersonal attunement" seen in longing for human friends and lovers).

Chapter 2 ("Friendship, Virtue, and Contemplation") clarifies how the difficulties with friendship examined in Chapter 1 might arise and be addressed by looking at such difficulties through the lens of the classical period -- especially in Aristotle, but also in Plato and Cicero -- where such problems are seen in an embryonic form. (To echo Aristotle: the buffered stance is like an acorn in the classical era that grew to oak-hood in the modern era.) The chapter begins with the partial success of Aristotle's views linking friendship and public virtue, but then focuses on the following issue that Aristotle (and others) don't quite resolve: "Friendship may well require virtue to succeed, but why do the virtuous need friendship? Are they not already self-sufficient unto themselves? Why, then should they need or desire a friend at all?" (38) Even Aristotle has trouble with this, argues Kimbriel, because of his deeper difficulty uniting civic and intellectual virtues, and (deeper still) because of his philosophy's structural integration of theology and metaphysics.

Chapter 3 ("Sacred Knowing and Indwelling Love") explores how the Gospel of John presents a distinctively porous view of the self and hence of friendship. The "central task" (68) of the chapter is tracing out how John's theological commitments influence his unique vision of friendship. For example, consider two verses:

John 15:15 (Jesus teaching disciples): "[a] No longer do I call you slaves, for the slave does not know what his master is doing. Instead, [b] I have called you friends, because I have made known to you everything that I have heard from my Father."

John 17:3 (Jesus praying): "Now this is eternal life, that they may know you, the only true God and Jesus Christ whom you have sent."

Kimbriel notes how 15:15(b) is "perhaps the central statement of friendship in the New Testament" (62), and while he notes that 17:3 suggests some common ground between John and Aristotle -- both Aristotle and John "consider the highest and most fitting human life to be centrally concerned with encountering the "Divine things" (in Aristotle's phrase) or the "only true God" (in John's)" (56) -- such passages also highlight John's distinctiveness.

Two commitments in particular help John succeed where Aristotle faltered on friendship: "(1) the insistence that the God who is the absolute creator of all that exists is himself centrally defined by the love between Father and Son and (2) that the Son has come near in the incarnation to befriend humanity" (68). But these commitments also "bring practice and contemplation into near identification with one another" (69) even beyond friendship. These commitments have implications for knowledge. In contrast with a disengaged model of knowledge, John sees right knowing and right loving as inseparable.

I think Chapter 3 is the centerpiece of the book, and Kimbriel's excellent summing-up and looking-forward at the start of Chapter 4 confirm that, indeed, a corner has been turned. John's "theological and metaphysical commitments issue forth in a radically non-disengaged stance to reality" (72), which will be unpacked further in Augustine (Chapters 4 and 5) and Aquinas (Chapters 6 and 7).

Chapter 4 ("The Porous Enquirer") explores how Augustine's porous approach contrasts with buffered approaches. This is important for Kimbriel's project for several reasons, one of which is that it helps balance Taylor's tendency to see Augustine's role as one of opening the very door to philosophical interior-izing that Descartes eventually charges through. Kimbriel accents three features of Augustine's writings. First, ordinary activities like human friendships are the product of divine gift and can illumine the structure of love. Second, enmeshment with such human practices can actually give us a kind of knowledge of God. Third, enquiry in particular can involve the enquirer in contact with God not only as an object of study (as in Aristotle) but also as a co-laborer and friend who stands alongside, with, even in, the enquirer. In unpacking this last point about how Augustine views God as Inner Teacher at the center of Augustine's own personality, Kimbriel emphasizes an idea that he will return to as a refrain: "not all that is interior is one's own" (98).

Chapter 5 ("The Veiled Path: Enquiry, Agency, and Desire") builds on this in two ways: by highlighting how Augustine's engaged view of human agency differs from a disengaged view of the same, and how this engaged view of agency both mirrors and improves upon several insights in Plato's understanding of desire and friendship in his later works. Both Plato and Augustine view reason as walking a veiled path of right desires, leading enquirers from ignorance to knowledge; likewise, both view love -- giving it and receiving it -- as able to spark such right desires. But Augustine, unlike Plato, views love (Divine love; God) as the source of all existence and as increasingly incarnational within creation. Augustine can emphasize both the fragmented existence of all souls that do not know and love God as God knows and loves them, and the hopeful path to wholeness that all souls can tread by God's gift. Kimbriel echoes Augustine's hope that the gifts of faculties even in the most "disengaged stance can blend with God's touch of awakening a longing for Him.

Chapters 6 and 7 explore Aquinas' views of friendship and knowing. Kimbriel focuses on Aquinas because he aims to supplement the historical narrative of how the disengaged stance emerged with a description of how the disengaged stance can be an "immanent possibility" within the "metaphysical situation" facing the porous enquirer (117).

Chapter 6 ("Human Finitude and the Paradox of Enquiry") unpacks the views of Aquinas regarding desire and the act of understanding within the structure of enquiry, with an eye towards a certain paradox: what we most want to know and see is God's face -- but we can't. "It is not merely that the human has fallen away from its proper communion with the highest things but that she is in principle unable to encounter that for which she longs. Her light is too dim to behold it; her being is unfit" (133). One temptation for dealing with this paradox of human limitation and finitude is to deny it. Kimbriel argues that the disengaged stance is one way of giving into this temptation. But how?

A common strategy for "re-establish[ing] parity" between our grand longings and our modest capacities is to deny the grandeur or the modesty (or both) -- for example, "to attempt to reduce one's longing by attaching it to some lesser good and thereby maintaining the illusion of attainable satisfaction" (133-34). Such misplaced love, however, can attach not only to substitutes like wealth, but to disengagement itself. Whereas Aquinas sees happiness is found primarily in God himself as the object of enjoyment (and not merely the human soul's good or functioning), the disengaged stance shifts to seeing the subject's knowledge (even of God), certainty (even about God) and control (even of our clear and distinct ideas about God) as the new center of gravity. This suggestion -- that "disengaged enquiry . . . constitutes a particularly poor answer devised not so much for the sake of understanding but for the sake of protecting the self from vulnerability" (137) -- is important for Kimbrell; it "gets to the heart of the misgiving about the rationality of disengaged enquiry that has been building throughout this work" (136).

Chapter 7 ("Friendship and Deification") explores Aquinas' better way of responding to the paradox of inquiry: friendship with God. Such friendship gradually "deifies" human souls by making them more and more like that which they long for and commune with. As Kimbriel's quote at the start of this review indicates, charity -- what Aquinas identifies as "the friendship of man for God" -- genuinely resolves the paradox at the levels of both theory and practice, "by offering a path upon which the human might become fit to encounter that for which she longs" (138). In his revealing conclusion to the chapter, Kimbriel expands on Aquinas' intricate discussion of wisdom as "charity's gift" (156):

Charity, as I have argued, is the experience of this movement into deification as the soul's felt affinity with God himself perpetually deepens. . . . It is in this regard, by coming to have a sensed affinity for the Divine, that the human person comes to feel what she cannot yet see. . . . It is in this fashion that charity makes it possible to dwell within the paradoxicality of finitude. . . . But, likewise, such felt affinity directs and intensifies one's quest for final real union with God. (159-60)

In the book's Conclusion, Kimbriel elegantly summarizes his entire argument, restates his affinity with and differences from Taylor's approach, and finishes on a hopeful note for even those who are mired in disengagement.

Let me close with two thoughts on the work as a whole.

First: among the book's many virtues is its balanced combination of careful exegetical scholarship and complex philosophical argument. The scholarship is on full display throughout -- both in the main body of the text (where direct quotations and Greek/Latin transliterations are used judiciously but frequently) and in the back matter (26-page endnotes, 17-page bibliography of primary/secondary texts, 9-page index). And the argument, while complex, is relatively succinct (172 pages) and is faithfully previewed in the book's introduction (1-6), repeatedly consolidated in each chapter's introduction and conclusion, and eventually summarized in the book's Conclusion (161-72). Such consistent signposts help the non-exegete to stay on track without getting lost. Kimbriel's writing style is patient, subtle, and engaging, and his achievements here will be useful to a wide range of scholars -- in historical philosophy, for sure, but also in those interested in friendship, the self, knowledge, and theology.

Second: one of the things I found intriguing about the book is that Kimbriel occasionally suggests a certain incommensurability between the disengaged stance (which he's critical of) and the positive porous stance (which he recommends). For example, he sometimes says that the disengaged stance too often assumes its own validity when it attempts to dialog with the porous stance. But his book as a whole makes a very strong case that the two approaches really can dialog fairly well with each other, and indeed in such ways as to poke a few pores in the most committed buffer. Here's another way of putting this point. Kimbriel argues that the disengaged stance is not merely an intellectual repudiation of the porous stance, but a peculiar practical way of dealing with tensions latent within the porous stance. But perhaps something like the converse is true as well. Perhaps, that is, the porous stance is not merely an intellectual repudiation of the disengaged stance, but a peculiar practical way of dealing with tensions latent within the disengaged stance. Indeed, one charitable way of seeing Kimbriel's book is that it is, itself, an instrumental tool for even the most thoroughgoing disengaged person to use in overcoming her isolation. She can turn the historical trajectory from porous to disengaged inside out, within her very own person, from the solitude of her very own room. Just as she might open her front door when a friend stands at that door and knocks. "Why, then it is that the incalculable may occur."