Friendship in an Age of Economics: Resisting the Forces of Neoliberalism

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Todd May, Friendship in an Age of Economics: Resisting the Forces of Neoliberalism, Lexington Books, 2012, 164pp., $60.00 (hbk) ISBN 9780739175811.

Reviewed by Diane Jeske, University of Iowa


Todd May presents friendship as a relationship that has the potential, at least in some of its forms, to undermine what he sees as the dominance of 'neo-liberal' economic, political, and social structures. His primary claim is that 'deep' friendship is a relationship between equals that is characterized by trust and provides meaning (which is not the same as happiness) to our lives. Insofar as neo-liberal institutions are non-egalitarian and have no room for trust, May argues, friendship provides a training ground for solidarity movements with the potential to undermine the dominance of neo-liberalism.

While I am more than sympathetic with May's understanding of friendship as central to the meaning and purpose of our lives, I worry that he too often makes quite sweeping claims of an empirical nature about the effects of current economic and political arrangements on our psyches. Such claims, in order to be persuasive, need far more documentation than the handful of psychological and sociological studies cited by May. But, in any case, I am a philosopher, so I am going to restrict my discussion of his claims to those that are of a philosophical and non-empirical nature.

The central tenet of neo-liberalism as understood by May is that "an unfettered (or largely unfettered) capitalist market is the best and most efficient way for an economy to run" (4). Neo-liberals link economic freedom with political freedom -- one of the best known of neo-liberals who makes such a linkage is the libertarian Milton Friedman. Since neo-liberalism has dominated our social structures, beginning sometime in the 1970's, wealth has become more and more concentrated among a smaller and smaller sector of the population, leading some Marxist critics to see neo-liberalism as a strategy for the restoration of upper-class power. May, however, resists attributing any such conspiratorial motivation to neo-liberalism's advocates -- he is concerned with the effects of neo-liberalism's dominance and so has no need to cast aspersions on the integrity of neo-liberals such as Friedman.

May relies heavily on the notion of a figure, which he borrows from Foucault. Figures are "people inasmuch as those people embody certain characteristics produced by the time in which they live" (17). So it seems that to speak of a figure is just to speak of a person who has some property that is distinctive of persons (or of the categories salient to those doing the categorizing) in the particular socio-historical era in which they live. The two figures of neo-liberalism are the consumer and the entrepreneur. The consumer is a person for whom "buying is a central part of [her] sense of who [she] is" (32), while the entrepreneur is someone who sees her life in terms of "calculative self-enhancement" while viewing others "as means for personal gain" (42). Both are egoists, but while the consumer is geared toward present consumption in order to gain pleasure, the entrepreneur looks to make investments that will pay off in the future (32ff.).

May stresses that no one's identity is exhausted by one or both of the neo-liberal figures, so even someone who is one or both of these figures can have friendships that are not neo-liberal in character. Neo-liberal friendships correspond to Aristotle's two types of less-than-ideal friendships, those of pleasure and those of convenience or utility. For the consumer, friendships are relationships geared to present pleasure -- the friend is the person who provides that pleasure. For the entrepreneur, friendships are investments geared to future reward. But, May claims, the best friendships "have elements that are implicit struggles against neo-liberalism" (59).

Deep friendships are not egoist, but, rather, other-regarding -- in these relationships, each friend seeks the good of the other for its own sake (79). May draws upon Elizabeth Telfer in his explication of the nature of friendship. Telfer claims that "'there are three necessary conditions for friendship: shared activities, the passions of friendship, and acknowledgement of the fulfillment of the first two conditions'" (71). This is one aspect of May's book that is disappointing. Telfer's article on friendship was published in 1971, and there has been quite a bit of philosophical work on the nature of friendship published in the decades since then that May simply does not address. So for anyone who has been engaged in this on-going philosophical exploration of friendship, May's discussions will be unsatisfying.

Take just one example: May claims that "it is the person, not the sum of the characteristics, that one likes in a friendship [sic]" (81; cf. 83, 96, 98). But here is one of the central issues in the philosophy of friendship: what is it to love a person if it is not to love the 'sum of the characteristics'? What is the person over and above all of her properties arranged in a particular way? Is the person some sort of Cartesian ego? If so, then to love a person would be to love her Cartesian ego. But Cartesian egos are indistinguishable one from another except via their contingent properties, so what would it be to love a Cartesian ego for its own sake? I am not suggesting that May would need to settle this debate, but I think that if an author is going to make contentious claims, then he needs to at least indicate the contentious nature of those claims.

Let's return to May's conception of deep friendship (or communicating friendship). These sorts of friends "are those through and with whom we develop ourselves, each other, and one another" (89). Deep friends help us to reconsider our 'evaluative outlooks': May says that we can 'use' such friends to "help us recognize how we're looking at things and what the implications of that looking are" (89). It seems that this kind of mutual aid in self-improvement and growth is what May takes to be necessary to and distinctive of deep friendships as opposed to the neo-liberal friendships of pleasure and utility. He admits that deep friendships also require sympathy and companionship, but the mutual reflection on evaluative outlooks is what makes the friendship 'deep.'

One of the primary features of neo-liberal friendships, according to May, is their egoist, individualist, character. Deep friendships are supposed to contrast with that aspect of neo-liberal friendships in so far as the former are such that the friends care about each other for their own sakes. But there is some tension in May's view here. He focuses on growth and self-development as an essential aspect of deep friendship, and he explicitly says that we can 'use' our deep friends to help us to reassess and understand our evaluative outlooks. So there seems to be an egoistic element to deep friendships as well: they are means to a goal of making ourselves better people with more clearly articulated and assessed evaluative outlooks. Now May clearly wants to say that even if that is true, we value the friends and our friendships with them non-instrumentally, as ends in themselves. But notice that it is possible to value a friend and our friendship with her non-instrumentally in a variant of a friendship for pleasure as well: we simply substitute talk of pleasure for May's talk of self-awareness and self-growth as what we 'use' our friend to achieve. In a friendship for utility, we 'use' the friend -- whom we care about for her own sake -- to advance our career or to help us make better choices in the stock market. In fact, in many of my own friendships, I look to my friends for any number of things: a good friend who is a philosopher reads and comments on my work, another good friend who is an MD helps me to navigate the health care system as I take care of my family members, and I take spin classes from another friend.

With some of my best friends, shopping is an activity around which many of our interactions take place: I even take trips with friends for the purpose of shopping, or get together with them to browse a favorite catalog. There is certainly an element of consumerism here and it is our roles as consumers that bring us pleasure. But it is also the being of consumers together that matters, and in our shared consumerism, we enjoy our pleasure together. I simply don't see that as at all incompatible with caring about each other for our own sakes. My point is just that the elements of friendships that May has divvied up between friendships of pleasure, friendships of utility, and deep friendships are not so separable, and they combine in different and unique ways in different friendships.

There is also a serious downplaying of the role of pleasure or enjoyment in friendship in May's account, because he sees the consumer (of whom he clearly disapproves) as oriented toward pleasure, in particular toward the pleasure of the moment. But for many of us, one of the most valuable aspects of friendship is that they allow us to sink into the moment, to laugh, to release stress. None of this denies what May takes to be crucial to friendship, namely its foundation in the past. Shared senses of humor are for many of us essential to our ability to get close to another person, and those senses of humor then develop in harmony and call upon a shared past -- this is why 'private jokes' are so prominent in many good friendships. When a friendship is no longer enjoyable, one may still have special obligations to the other, but it may be time to consider whether the friendship ought to be maintained.

Finally, May sees deep friendships as a training ground for participation in movements of solidarity that seek to resist and undermine neo-liberalism. Deep friendships are relations between equals that involve trust, and May sees neo-liberalism as inimical to trust and equality. This move made me wonder about the kind of evaluative outlooks that are allowed to be considered between deep friends. For example, could Milton Friedman or Margaret Thatcher, two neo-liberals par excellence according to May, be party to a deep friendship? After all, their evaluative outlooks involve, at least in part, neo-liberalism itself. I myself have a very close friend who is, according to May's characterization, a neo-liberal. Can May allow that he and I have a deep friendship, given that he often advocates for free market ideals in our discussions? These questions make me worry that there might be hidden constraints on what sorts of views can be espoused within a friendship if that friendship is to remain deep. Again, my worry is that the actual territory of lived friendships is much more complicated than May's categories seem to allow.

May's book makes many insightful claims and raises a lot of intriguing questions about the nature of friendship and its role in the good life. I have reservations about the ways in which he has attempted to characterize and categorize friendships. I think that going about the understanding of friendship with politics as a starting point has misled May in certain ways: his dislike of neo-liberalism has guided his approach to friendship and, I fear, led to an oversimplification of the phenomena of friendship. However, those who share his antipathy toward neo-liberalism will still find much to praise in this work.