Friendship Reconsidered: What it Means and How it Matters to Politics

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P. E. Digeser, Friendship Reconsidered: What it Means and How it Matters to Politics, Columbia University Press, 2016, 361pp., $65.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780231174343.

Reviewed by Sibyl A. Schwarzenbach, City University of New York


Recent decades have witnessed an explosion of scholarly interest in the concept of friendship, a topic long neglected by our dominant liberal political tradition. In step with this renaissance, P. E. Digeser has written a wide-ranging, ambitious and knowledgeable book aiming to illuminate the complex relation between friendship and politics. The tripartite work moves beyond an analysis of friendship in the private sphere (Part I), to focus on tensions and ideals of civic friendship (Part II), and to a more speculative discussion of the possibility of international friendship between states (Part III). Bringing together literature from political science, anthropology, sociology as well as philosophy, the author conceives friendship as a set of social practices bearing a family resemblance, but with varying motivations and resulting in different activities.

At the same time, Digeser "reconsiders" friendship, setting forth ideals internal to these practices, and reveals how the concept may illuminate and guide our political life. The work raises a host of fascinating and important questions and seeks to answer them in a clear and fair manner, as the author traces the concept through myriad contexts. Digeser's discussion is valuable not only as an introduction, but also as an overview and significant contribution to the burgeoning literature of friendship studies.

Part I focuses on personal friendship and is concerned with clarifying various conceptual matters. In Chapters 1 and 2, Digeser forgoes the search for necessary and sufficient conditions and explores friendship as a "set of social practices" (à la Oakeshott) whereby typical traits of friendship bear little more than family resemblances to one another. Employing Wittgenstein's notion of a language game, there appears to be no one element common to all the different cultural practices of friendship, but only traits or clusters of intertwining traits. Still, these practices structure our expectations and not just any motivation or action will do. Emerging from the rich and diverse set of practices is a repertoire of what the author calls "ordinarily appropriate motivations" such as love, respect, affection, a disposition to protect and support, and self-disclosure among others (xx). So too, our actions are expected to "subscribe to certain adverbial requirements" or general rules as to how friends go about interacting with each other, for example, considerately, loyally, lovingly, playfully, etc. (xiv, 51; 72). Digeser is not the first to view friendship as a set of social practices, but the approach proves illuminating in her hands.

For instance, motivations ranging anywhere from utility, self-interest, pity or duty to altruism and love, are often present and a part of some but not all empirical practices of personal friendship, and yet legitimate limits can be drawn. There must be some form of "mutual recognition of appropriate motivations"; one cannot have a one-sided friendship (26, 31). So too, appropriate motives must predominate, at least in what the author calls the "current Western manifestation" of friendship practices. Chapter 3 illustrates this thesis further and provides a valuable -- and eminently sensible -- discussion of obligation in friendship, charting a middle ground position between those who claim duty plays no role in motivating genuine friendship (e.g., Michael Stocker) and those who argue that such motivation is essential (e.g. Joseph Raz). Employing the helpful notion of "deficient reasons", whereby acting from duty (without desire, say, because one feels one ought, reluctantly, out of pity, etc.) may be an occasional motive of being a good friend, Digeser shows it cannot be the central motive or basis of the relation as a whole. Duty as motive is "deficient"; it cannot support the practice of friendship on its own. This seems right and such analyses are among the best parts of Digeser's book; perhaps they will even lay to rest many of the endless back and forth arguments regarding duty and friendship (similarly with other motives such as self-interest and utility).

Part I concludes with Chapter 4 in which the author proffers an ideal of personal friendship that is not only compatible with but both "serves and is served by a robust conception of individuality". Following Richard E. Flathman, Digeser calls this ideal "self-enacted individuality" and it requires both a bonding of "mutually recognized sentiments" or motivations, and a bridging of "the differences generated by individuality"; here friends reciprocally "work upon themselves to best assist the self-enacted individuality of each other" (xvii, 74ff ). The author places much emphasis on self-command and autonomy, as well as on voluntary features that are "extended and elaborated" such that we, in interacting with friends, develop and even 'choose' our own sentiments (76-8). In justifying this ideal over possible alternatives, the author claims that it expresses "some of the central characteristics found within our practices of friendship in a more complete manner. That is, it makes friendship more thoroughly chosen and voluntary" (75, 101).

The question arises why making friendship "more thoroughly chosen and voluntary" is necessarily a good thing, especially since doing so excludes so vast a part of our best relationships: among parents and their children, say, or among cousins, people thrown together in grammar school, under harsh circumstances such as slavery, etc. The book never answers this question. Much recent work on friendship, however, has tried to broaden our spindly inherited notion of friendship, focusing on good relations beyond the standard inherited from Aristotle: of two independent, autonomous (typically male) individuals, of the same age and status, freely interacting with one another. Feminists, for instance, have pointed out how responsibilities and helping the other (whether their own children, other women, etc.) may predominate over self-actualization, especially short-term, and religious groups have stressed the importance of long-term commitment or service. Germans emphasize trust and loyalty. Even between two independent mature American males, one friend may try to convince the other to put away his Nietzschean obsession with "individuality" and begin developing a genuine social conscience.

Be this as it may, in Part II the author turns to the relation between personal friendship (in its various guises) and the domestic political domain, connecting friendship directly or indirectly to political institutions and exploring the ideal of civic friendship. Traditionally, liberals have remained skeptical of mixing friendship with politics; it implies for them bias, partiality, cronyism and corruption. Friendship has been and should remain relegated to the private sphere. In Chapters 5 and 6, Digeser bucks this status quo position and convincingly argues that friends today are taking over many of the roles (e.g. emotional and material support) earlier performed by family (5), an institution thoroughly regulated by the state. So too, she argues that having good friendships need not necessarily be at odds with impartiality and fair procedure (167ff, 175), and that an ideal of civic friendship may overcome liberal notions of alienated individuality by transforming the notion of self-interest to include the interests of others (106, 122ff). Later, in Part III, she argues that friendships between minimally just states might generate a different politics than that standardly conceived by International Relations theory (259, 277).

At the same time, always seeking the middle ground, Digeser argues against those who put forth a "strong ideal" of civic friendship or who argue for it as a general model of democratic citizenship. Digeser rejects this strong ideal for standard liberal reasons: "the mutual recognition of the requisite motivations for friendship is impossible in large, complex societies" (108). Size matters and civic friendship is not scalable, although it might still be possible as "a limited ideal of citizenship" (109).

Here a misunderstanding persists. In step with nearly the whole of the liberal tradition, and despite her efforts to "reconsider" friendship, Digeser ends by continuing to conflate civic friendship with personal friendship. Everyone agrees that we cannot be personal friends with all citizens. But this is not what theorists from Aristotle to John Cooper argue. Civic friendship refers to traits of friendship such as awareness, good will, mutuality, helping fellow citizens, etc. only these traits and values are now embodied in and work through the form and content of a society's laws, via its constitution and major social and economic institutions -- in the modern period through some doctrine of individual rights -- as well as only indirectly via the willingness (to whatever degree) of everyday citizens to uphold these institutions in practice. With civic friendship, that is, such traits become embodied in the basic structure of a society: in how its main social, economic and political institutions hang together in one scheme. To take but one example: a society in which adequate health care is institutionally and universally granted to all citizens, and recognized by (nearly) all citizens as a legitimate expectation and a civic right, is a society which reveals a greater civic friendship -- embodies a greater care and concern for all citizens -- than one that allows its fellows willy-nilly and Cyclops-fashion to fend for themselves. And this is the case whether the society consists of 50,000 or 250 million.

Digeser argues, however, that citizens of large states "can't possibly know" the motives of fellow citizens (57), which is the point at which she draws a line around the concept. But is this true? Indeed, we do not know personally the vast majority of our fellow citizens, but we can learn (be educated) about many of them and we frequently still read off their motives: from the wording of legislation (where the intention of the law is often explicitly stated), to speeches and platforms of politicians, from voting results and major social practices, to demonstrations, marches and book burnings. When I discover a ten-foot white burning cross on my lawn in the middle of the night, I can be pretty certain that the motives of my fellow citizens are not friendly. Digeser also grants that social scientists have shown we frequently misidentify the motives of persons we know well, and even our own motives (110). The issue is thus not a question of quantitative size but of the qualitative structure of our social practices and institutions, and of how transparent (and sincere, etc.) the intentions there embodied are.

At the same time, Digeser's more bounded, "moderate ideal" of civic friendship (111) presents serious problems of its own. "Even if friendship cannot be incorporated into a general model of citizenship it can be included in a civic ideal that some citizens may choose to enact with one another" (xvii, 57, 142). Not surprisingly, Digeser's civic ideal is fully voluntary, and the group of citizens to whom it applies must be "small enough such that they can recognize one another's motives". "Civic friendships are like islands in a larger sea of citizen-strangers or -- acquaintances as friends" (115). Here the reader sees again that for Digeser civic friendships are in actuality sets of personal friendships, only now "conditioned by politics" (122). But such seem closer to civil friendships or to friendship-groups within civil society. In relinquishing the goal of friendship being truly "civic" -- and thus extending certain characteristics of friendship via law and just social institutions to all citizens -- it is unclear what prevents Digeser's internal islands of civic friends from turning against their fellows, or even against the body politic as a whole. Does Digeser wish to include or to exclude de facto political friendship groups -- say, among members of the Ku Klux Klan -- from her ideal of a civic friendship? Once again, the answer is unclear.

Chapter 6 turns to the fascinating topic of friendship "in dark times" or under de-legitimized political regimes. After problematizing Arendt's argument that friendships under tyranny can engender plurality, Digeser enters an in-depth discussion of how it is possible for a civic friend to remain fair and impartial even in the most dangerous circumstances. She relates the story of the Ancient Roman banker Titus Pomponius Atticus (110-32 BC) who refuses to takes sides during the Roman civil wars even though many of his own friends (including Cicero, Marcus Brutus, Caesar and Anthony) were bitter enemies. Atticus is even put forth by the author as an ideal civic friend in dark times (147). He maintained many of his intimate friendships, though conditioned by deep political differences; he revealed an integrity and even-handedness in supporting his friends, even despite "their willingness to kill one another" (168) and his being in danger himself. In general, Atticus' actions revealed his rejection of a simple 'us versus them' mentality, which allowed the possibility of "cooperation and perhaps even reconciliation" (147). Again, Digeser's story confirms that to be a "civic friend" for her is to be fair and principled in regard to one's personal friends even in dangerous contexts.

Part II ends with a discussion of how social and political institutions may clearly impede personal friendships (consider anti-miscegenation laws) and argues that the state has a negative duty to remove such obstacles. The author concludes, however, that positive state action in the name of supporting friendships is more problematic (199).

Finally, Part III turns to friendship in the international context. Chapter 8 focuses on the relationship between political associations and argues that so-called friendships between states need not reduce to mere alliances or instrumental partnerships; Carl Schmitt's "us versus them" mentality, so central still to International Relations theory, is again being rejected. Chapter 9 argues that minimally just states may even be considered "character friends" to one another; these states have reasons to protect and promote the fellow state's just institutions, not merely their own (252ff). Again, this seems right and an important contribution to the literature. Interestingly enough, however, Digeser here follows Andrea Oelsner and begins to connect traits of friendship with rule-governed practices, justice, and "institutional qualities" (251) as well with relations between minimally just nation-states (253) -- political associations whereby it could never be the case that literally "everyone knows the motives of everyone else". But if such structural friendship is seen as possible in the international domain of political associations and nation-states, it remains unclear why the author worked so hard to deny the possibility of a rule-governed institutional friendship between all citizens in the domestic case.

In sum, the strengths of Digeser's book are intimately tied to its weaknesses: the discussion traverses a vast literature and raises a wide array of topics and questions such that depth and argument sometimes suffer. Quite a few will find the work sticks too closely to what friendship means in "our" current western Anglo-American market culture: a voluntary, purely chosen, often masculinist individualism, a fluid and ever shifting personal relationship aiming at the self-enacted individuality of both parties. Certain cultural groups might even see this particular ideal as the opposite of true friendship. Many of my foreign students, for instance, repeatedly complain to me that Americans "just don't get it" when it comes to friendship. For these students, friendship means a rock of stability, someone one can count on, a deep and long term reciprocal commitment and practical love, as well as a willingness to sacrifice for the other, above all, to give the shirt off one's back, etc.

Still, amidst the sweep of Digeser's treasure trove of questions and reflections on the nature of friendship, there is certain to be much of interest in this book for everyone.