From Affectivity to Subjectivity: Husserl's Phenomenology Revisited

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Christian Lotz, From Affectivity to Subjectivity: Husserl's Phenomenology Revisited, Palgrave Macmillan, 2008, 224pp., $74.95 (hbk), ISBN 9780230535336.

Reviewed by A. D. Smith, University of Warwick


I would normally begin a review by giving a general account of what the reviewed book is about. This is somewhat difficult in the present case, since the book consists of three chapters that do not really hang together and do not present a cumulative account. Suffice it to say that this is a book on Husserl that addresses a number of issues that pertain to his philosophy.

Throughout his career Husserl was repeatedly vexed by the question of how to introduce transcendental phenomenology. This is a problem because, as Husserl repeatedly admitted, phenomenology involves taking up an unnatural attitude to the world and ourselves: one that is at variance with our everyday, and even scientific, ways of thought that are dominated by what Husserl called the "natural attitude." So what should induce us to relinquish this attitude, and follow Husserl's "unnatural" path? In the first part of the initial chapter of this book Christian Lotz offers an anodyne suggestion. Husserl claimed that transcendental phenomenology is characterised by two fundamental features. First, it involves the epoché: the "bracketing" of our belief that a real world exists, therefore instituting a "reduction," or restriction, of what the phenomenologist is to investigate what holds good even if there is no such world. Secondly, phenomenology is an eidetic discipline: it concerns not individual objects or experiences, even when they have been "purified" by the epoché, but essences, the essential kinds of possible objects and experiences. Lotz's proposal is to privilege the second of these at the expense of the first.

Lotz allies the former approach to a demand for apodicticity. Searching for that which remains even if the world does not exist is to search for that of which we are absolutely certain. But Husserl himself expresses misgivings about this quest. It would tie phenomenology specifically to the "Cartesian way" into phenomenology; and Husserl explicitly states that this is not the only way. Moreover, highlighting the eidetic nature of phenomenology would make this discipline an easily intelligible enterprise, because an eidetic investigation involves the employment of the imagination. We imaginatively vary phenomena, and in so doing come up against a limit to what we can thus imaginatively vary. This, according to Husserl, gives us an insight into essences. But imaginative variation is something that we are familiar with in the natural attitude. Lotz relates it, in particular, to play. Not only does this approach make the phenomenological enterprise humanly intelligible, it roots phenomenology in anthropology. This is because the concept of play can be "developed within an anthroplogical perspective" (9). Hence, Lotz claims, "We find phenomenological thinking -- if we leave Husserl's technical conception of the epoché aside -- rooted in anthropological elements that I have described as playing" (24).

I find this account wholly unconvincing on two counts. First, there is no reason to focus on play as the "natural" key to imaginative variation. As Lotz himself states at one point (23), eidetic variation is a standard procedure in theoretical science -- a point that Husserl himself makes. Perhaps one could argue that play is the transcendental condition of science. That would be an interesting idea. But Lotz does not develop it. In the absence of arguing such a case, Lotz's focus on play is gratuitous.

Secondly, to focus exclusively on the eidetic character of phenomenology is totally to miss the radicality of that enterprise. This is already implicit in the previous point. If the essence of phenomenology is the eidetic approach, and if this is already to be found in science and play, what is all the phenomenological fuss about? We already have the essence of the matter in hand in the natural attitude. Lotz is completely wrong. It is the first characteristic of phenomenology that is decisive. It is this alone that gets us out of the natural attitude and into a transcendental one. "Eidetic" does not imply "transcendental." Moreover, Lotz's tying this first approach to a Cartesian "way" into phenomenology is a mistake. Husserl does, indeed, sketch different ways into phenomenology, and some of them are non-Cartesian in not being driven by the demand for apodicticity. But they all essentially involve the epoché. Indeed, if they did not, they would not be ways into transcendental phenomenology. The idea that phenomenology should be rooted in anthropology would have been anathema to Husserl. Indeed, Husserl's objection to Heidegger was that the latter's philosophy was essentially merely anthropological in character. There is, to be sure, a sense in which Husserl's own phenomenology is anthropological. Husserl states, for example, that it is necessary that transcendental subjectivity incarnate itself as "man." But what Lotz's account of phenomenology in terms of (natural) play occludes is that Husserl advocates a transcendental anthropology. To miss this is to miss the essence of Husserl's thought. I should say that Lotz is ambivalent about the strength of the claim he wishes to make. Sometimes he seems simply to be emphasising the essential importance of the eidetic method to phenomenology. That, however, is an uninteresting claim, since no one would deny it. At other times, however, he goes further -- as when he claims that phenomenology "can be grounded in anthropological considerations" (8), and that he is claiming a "primacy of play over reflection" (10) -- over, that is to say, transcendental reflection conducted within the epoché. It is this that is false.

The second half of the first chapter is considerably more convincing. It is a short but interesting account of the hermeneutic dimension to phenomenology: in particular, the way in which misunderstanding and incomprehension have a motivational force for phenomenology. Lotz relates this issue to Husserl's distinction between static and genetic phenomenological methods. What genetic phenomenology especially embodies is the realisation that intentional analysis must be conducted within a "sense-tradition" (32), within horizons of already constituted signification that, according to Lotz, we can never make transparent to ourselves.

The second chapter of the book is by far the longest, and by far the best. Here Lotz focuses on the fundamental importance of affection for Husserl's philosophical account of our reality. His main claim is that affection should be seen as a primarily normative or "proto-ethical" phenomenon. Lotz's argument is convincing. I cannot here do justice to the intricacy and depth of his account. The general idea, however, is that being affected cannot be dissociated from feeling, which in turn is to be understood in terms of an appreciation of value. The chapter also contains comparisons of Husserl's ideas in this area with those of Levinas and Fichte. This part of the book without doubt constitutes a valuable addition to Husserl scholarship.

The central issue of the concluding chapter is the sense in which a one’s life as a whole is phenomenologically available to her. Lotz clearly expounds Husserl's view that, cognitively, my past life is made available as a life for me only through recollection. (The chapter contains some detailed exposition of Husserl's notion of "presentification," of which recollection is one form.) Although Husserl was of the view that it is ideally possible for a subject to view the entirety of his past life, this is but an ideal possibility. And Lotz stresses the way in which, therefore, for the cognitive point of view, my life as a whole is unavailable to me. He then raises the important question of the extent to which we may have a practical grasp of this life as such. Lotz then turns to the Kaizo articles in which Husserl expounds his concept of renewal. Husserl insists that we are called upon to shape our lives into a unity of willing and action guided by reason. Since, as Husserl states, such renewal affects "the whole life-nexus, the concrete lifetime," perhaps we here have a means, impossible at the cognitive level, by which our whole lives can become available to us.

Lotz has some harsh (and, I think, somewhat blinkered) though very sketchy things to say about Husserl's notion of renewal. But what is puzzling about the attempt to present the shaping of one's life into a unity, which renewal involves, as a more promising alternative to a cognitive grasp of one's life as a whole, is that Husserl repeatedly writes of renewal in terms of one’s becoming a new person. The problem with the cognitive access that I have to my life as a whole was, however, the problem of my access to the person that I actually was throughout my past. The problem was, as it were, that of my access to the "old" person. Showing that I can fashion myself into a "new" person hardly addresses this issue. Of course, Husserl's talk of a "new person" does not imply that he thought that the very identity of the "monad," which I ultimately and concretely am, changed. That would make no sense. But that just shows that Husserl's notion of renewal simply operates on a different level, or is motivated by different concerns, from his discussions of my cognitive access to my life as a life "in itself."

So, this book is something of a mixed bag. It contains, especially in the long middle chapter, some valuable material, but some of the book is very dubious indeed. Also, as I stated at the beginning, the work does not hang together particularly well. In addition, there is a certain amount of repetition, as well as discussions of matters that do not essentially advance any argument or point of view. I do, indeed, have doubts about whether this material should really have been published as a book. Lotz might have been better advised to have presented the public with two or three good articles, rather than this somewhat unsatisfactory book.