From Communism to Capitalism: Theory of a Catastrophe

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Michel Henry, From Communism to Capitalism: Theory of a Catastrophe, Scott Davidson (tr.), Bloomsbury, 2014, 125pp., $29.95 (hbk), ISBN 9781472524317.

Reviewed by James G. Hart, Indiana University


Foundational Themes

This is a competent translation from the often difficult French of a work first published in 1990. It is a companion piece to Michel Henry's two-volume Marx (1976), and his Barbarie (1987). The translator provides a helpful preface and index.

Although Henry is perhaps best known for his writings on a "radical" transcendental phenomenology, the metaphysics of phenomenality, embodiment, and phenomenological theology, the economic-cultural-critical works form part of the intricate interwoven tapestry of his philosophy. The proximate occasion for this work was the fall of the Soviet Union in the 1980's, and the jubilant cries heard throughout Eastern Europe. Henry asks why the communist bureaucrats turned to the West and embraced what they had suppressed for half a century. He acknowledges that in fact most would say that the wholesale economic and political failure of the socialist regimes required embracing the free market and liberal democracies. But Henry points to a dark ominous similarity in the totalitarian communist/socialist regimes and liberal democracies: they all embrace non-living substitutes for life and thus, in a sense, death. Marx, who understood the essence of life, saw it attacked by capital and capitalists. But Marx was betrayed by Marxism, and in this sense he was and is the foe equally of liberal capitalism and what historically is called Marxism. In this book "Marx" practically stands for Henry's own thought. This review will not wrestle with the historical merits of this claim for near conceptual equivalence.

In all his writings, "life" is Henry's key concept. In earlier works he calls life "the essence of manifestation." The essence of manifestation, in much of Western philosophy, suffers from a hegemony of intentionality, which in this book and often elsewhere is called "representation." Something is manifest if and only if it is brought before the mind. And the mind itself is manifest by the mind's reflective turning back on itself. This book's key thesis, which founds Henry's critique of capitalism and socialism, is that "reality is not reducible to a representation or to a product of thought" (21). The emphasis here is less a critique of forms of subjective idealism or even representationalism, but rather all forms of intentionality, even realistic forms, for which manifestness is due to an act of manifestation "there in the world." Such views miss the self-manifestness that is "undergone" and non-intentional, which is prior to and a condition of the world's display.

The essence of manifestation is missed and distorted if the self-luminousness of the self, mind, consciousness, etc. are sought in that to which consciousness is directed and which thus defines life in terms of the subject/object relation. Life is then manifest by being an object at a distance and "in front of the gaze of thought": Vor-stellen (19, 23). It is thought of in terms of events and objects, and we are disposed to envisage it in terms of something appearing-as.

The central point of all philosophy for Henry is that there are no displaying or representing acts and thus no manifestation of ___ to ___ without one's being non-intentionally self-present. This self-presence itself is not a presencing of ___ to ___ but the non-objective transcendental condition of all such intentional worldly display. Heidegger's "world," as the luminous clearing within which everything appears, ties manifestation to the intentional being-in, opening-up, and "clearing-out" of a luminous space. But prior to this there is the self-presence, the "life" which is "ipseity" as the "living individual."

Foundational for economics in any context is the lived basic rhythm of 1) (drive, desire/need and fulfillment), 2) (drive, desire/need and fulfillment), 3) etc. (26). Living is inseparably the lived necessities of pain, suffering, cold, warmth, desire, need, hunger, thirst, pleasure, lust, etc., and the lived actualization of the means to respond to these in the appropriate ways. Here Henry speaks of "life" as itself a transcendental subject which experiences itself and engenders countless individuals, each of whom is a self striving to preserve itself (26). That life refers to unique individuals is key, and we will return to it. These elusive passages point to but do not explicitly refer to more elaborate metaphysical discussions in especially his later philosophical theological writings (cf. the conclusion below). For Henry "life" is not the fascist life-force, vitalism, or physics-based analyses of "life" as events in the world. "Life," as precisely what cannot be made present in perceptions or concepts, is an individual's non-reflective self-awareness. As Henry often says, biology knows nothing of "life" (14).

In this book, and even more so in the earlier one on Barbarism, Galileo's undermining of what Husserl eventually called "the life-world," or the world in which we live and which is perceptually available to us, finds a formidable foe. Henry's focus is how, since the impact of Galilean thought on natural and social sciences, and even on the wider culture, the world is stripped of its essential subjectivity. This is in part because the bodily sensible knowledge is devalued and then replaced by a rational knowledge exemplified in geometrical concepts, or mathematics generally. This is an ontological subversion because objective natural processes come to define action and thought, and in general displace "life."

This plays out in "economics," where the subjectivity of work is replaced by objective processes amenable to an abstract, even mathematical formulation, culminating in modern technology. Technological devices, e.g., credit default swaps, automatic rollovers, mutual funds, etc., are conceived as analogous to the objective contingent processes of nature. As such, they are thought of as the "real processes of production" and, because technology has its own growth process, it progressively eliminates from view living labor or subjectivity (82-84). If the telos of these technological-mathematical processes is money as what represents or is value, then the ontological subversion in economics parallels the Galilean one. What in itself is not-living becomes that which replaces life, and in as much as life pursues what is non-living as the measure of itself life is a form of suicide.

Basic Economics and Capitalism

"Economics" is a system of representation wherein the representing displaces the represented and assumes the guise of being the real foundational reality. The upshot is that life in the form of living labor, although the foundation of economic value and the entire economic world, is situated entirely outside the official sense of "economy" (85). Historically economics is rooted in need and the labor necessary to meet the need. (Nature as a source of wealth is not attended to by Henry.) Labor produces things for consumption and exchange. Exchange of heterogeneous goods, e.g., shoes, apples, and wheat, is based first on their mutual "use-value" for consumers/workers. But with disparate goods, what is the common metric for determining value? In spite of the disparity, labor and the time of labor become the common standard for measuring the different useful goods. These heterogeneous "commodities" may be exchanged on the basis of the respective labor and labor time involved in their production, and this may serve as the measure.

Henry speaks of "the shadow that looms over the human city . . . due to the impossibility of measuring the merit of each individual" (72). The problem of finding strict social justice in basic economics faces an abyss, which swallows all equivalences of an economic order, i.e., the abyss of the incommensurate non-sortal transcendental ipseity each is. But in addition there are the manifold differences of abilities, skills, etc. We might measure the objective duration, but can we measure the intensity, the facility, the skill, etc.?

In any case, exchange historically is motivated by the use-value of the products. And the exchange-value, as an abstraction and representation of the labor/labor time in the form of currency or money, had no other aim than to make exchange possible. As such, money (M) was a "technological" device to facilitate exchange of commodities (C). Thus, basic beginning economics seemingly is CMC. But as we know, and as Aristotle feared, the dynamic of "economics" became how to achieve the "valorization" of capital, i.e., enabling that at the end of the process there could be greater money than at the beginning. Thus we have "economics" in the form of 1) M1CM2; eventually what was an incidental "means" and "limit" of economics -- and one of its most hated aspects -- because against nature (Aristotle, Politics 1257b-1258b) becomes its essence: 2) M1M2M3. With 1) a new quantity is added to the quantity of existing money. How? Workers become available as commodities. If one is without the means of production or without land that may be worked, each worker may say: I can't "make a living" (survive by subsistence working) unless someone can make a living off me. In which case I can turn my body and the time of my life over to someone else's will and goals for money. But even in doing this I cannot have the distance from myself that enables me to sell off myself, nor can I sell off the self-experiencing of the suffering, pain, joy, stress, weariness, etc. that is inseparable from my sold labor. (My paraphrase here of 73-79.)

For 1) to happen the equivalence of C (labor/labor time) and M must be undone by increasing C through labor. If the first part of the work-day pays for C (labor, materials, tools, maintenance costs, etc.) then the second part of the work-day provides the surplus so that M2 results from increasing M1., by, e.g., doubling C (labor/labor time). Technology serves to increase surplus value by diminishing the cost/value C while increasing productivity (labor/labor time). There is more labor, more productivity, but the same wages, and thus more surplus value.

Capital growth M1M2M3 appears to occur on its own, but it of necessity "refers back to the action of the living individual and results exclusively from it" (61). The values are tied to valuing individuals, the subjectivity of the labor force of life, and to the value of the living individual's selling of him- or herself. It is key that the living individual creates more use value than he or she needs in order to survive, and this creates surplus value. The economy's capacity to grow is rooted in life's own metaphysical power to grow. Yet modern economics presents itself in terms of the monetary representations bereft of life, e.g., the fluctuations of values of currency and the selling and buying of stocks and bonds. "No abstraction or ideality has ever been able to produce a real action; consequently, it can only represent it" (75). But such a representation hides life and living labor and cannot account for its own existence or growth (63). It may point to its self-standing buildings that house its engines of production, but even then it conceals that these cannot sustain themselves without the care and maintenance of living labor.

Marxist Economics

Marxist economics is as blind to life as are capitalism and post-Galilean biology. As capitalism substitutes abstract quantitative representations for living labor, so Marxism annihilates life and the living individual with "abstract entities [like class membership] through which it claims to explain the totality of economic, historical, and social phenomena, and ultimately these individuals themselves" (26).

Henry's critique is not just of Marxism, but of social sciences in general, which hypostasize what they take to be properties of individuals. These, in regulating interrelatedness, determine and define the living individual. Each person is completely a "product of the times." Such science in no way reflects the most basic truth of life, i.e., the non-sortal non-objective transcendental ipseity (27-28). For Marxism "who one is" is a result of one's class, station, function, etc., and when revolution "rights" things the individual is condemned on the basis of her class and what she has done as a member of this class. Class, itself a sub-set of "society," always acts as a pre-existent cause of the singular individual all the way down to her depths.

Henry thus thinks this temptation to sociologize is due to Marxism's suppression of the radically subjective spirit and its propensity to think of the individual's "deepest essence" as a cluster of properties that have causal power. Sociologizing that posits general determining traits characterizing a class (such as uncertainty regarding work and security, a feeling of inferiority, etc.) misses that these are founded on and refer to "the fundamental affective determinations of life, to the individual's ownmost and deepest essence" (40), which itself is non-sortal.

It is not clear whether Henry would wholly reject the formative power of ideal objects, represented properties, "objective spirit," etc. in favor of the spirit's non-objective felt reverberations in its engagement with the world. Here, as elsewhere, the rejection of intentionality, especially that of labor's apperceptions in building, planning, and designing, undermines Henry's thesis. Whereas we support whole-heartedly his project of establishing the referent of first-person experience and reference as non-sortal and uniquely unique (see my Who One Is (Springer: 2009), who can fail to note the hyperbole in saying that each act of thought which defines the unique individual in a general term, is an act of murder (53), that wherever class or type categories are used to stand for the person, there is provided a justification for murder (109). Further, his own search for "essences" and basic distinctions, to say nothing of attending to the dictates of such ideal entities as syntax and grammar, would seem to violate the spirit of many of his discussions here. But the absurdities of "language speaks through us," where no one is speaking except automatons or the mythic objective spirit, are roundly and rightly rejected by him (27 ff.). Marxism elevates society, the state, the people, etc. and devalues the living individual. And Marxist praxis proposes that because the society is bad individuals are bad (30), because individuals are constituted by the properties of society.

It is clear that Henry recognizes that "rights" and "laws" can become vacuous if the material-economic conditions that are necessary to actualize these rights are not fulfilled. Yet this reader wants to hear what Henry thinks, e.g., of the power of authoritative ideal legal-objects that articulate rights to a guaranteed income and health care. Do they not have a kind of "being in themselves," which is more than being occasions or even necessary conditions for "the fundamental affective determinations of . . . the individual's ownmost and deepest essence" (40).

Nihilist fascism here gets special attention in relation to torture (46-50). Given the harbingers of death that are communism, capitalism and reductionist science, nihilist fascism embodies a more profound intimate negation of life. It, of course, negates one's first-personal self-experiencing by making it commensurate with objective representations of life or things in the world. But nihilist fascism's truth is revealed in torture because it instinctively grasps the metaphysical truth of life, and how this is revealed in one's first-personal undergoing, feeling, and suffering of oneself and one's desires and power to live. And whereas the truth of life is a pure undergoing of oneself, and painful suffering is actualizing this essence of life, by contrast, nihilist fascist torture is a metaphysical event. One may torture, for the sake of an end, e.g., extracting information from the captive. But nihilist fascist torture becomes an end in itself because it is addressed to life itself, to the individual person in her suffering of her unique being. Torture takes advantage of the ontological essence which is the capacity to feel in the sense of undergoing what and who one is; but here one is driven back "insufferably" to one's core self-experiencing without being able to withdraw from it/oneself. (Cf. Sartre's "I do not have my [extreme] pain, but I exist it.") To torture is to "set fire to pure subjectivity." But it is not done in order to acknowledge and finally give subjectivity back to itself, but rather it strives to create the supreme achievement and emotion of life's own self-negation.

The Polis

Liberal democracy, social democracy, etc. have sought a post-Enlightenment version of the ancient Greek polis. Henry sees forms of contempt for or bleaching of transcendental life in references to "the people" and most exhortations or mandates to the "political" or the "public". "The revaluation of the political is accompanied with the devaluation of the individual and presupposes it." (101). Perhaps here one overhears a critique of Arendt's notion of the polis as a "space of appearing" in which each discovers "who one is" through social interaction with others in "speech and deeds." Here the shadowy privacy of the life of intimacy and of strenuous labor is raised to a new key where individuals and works become manifest for all of us to see and where activities may be undertaken as transcending bodily and/or merely instrumental necessity, and which are worthy of pursuit as ends in themselves. The polis is the world as the common space where common goods are pursued or enjoyed. These are both goals in common correlated with joint action. Similarly in the polis common goods are pursued, which are commonly necessary and useful, like clean water and bridges. And there are the common goods that require public display and enjoyment but which are not diminished in their being enjoyed by many. These are the necessarily common and universal goods like the arts, science, and philosophy. These polis-founded considerations clearly work against Henry's critique of intentionality and the preference for, if not restriction to, manifestation as life's lived first-personal non-intentional self-manifestation.

In this regard, Henry's notion of intersubjectivity is not rooted in the intentional achievement whereby one empathically displaces oneself to a transcendent point of view of another in order to fashion a common world; rather, for Henry there is an original being-in-common that unfolds and draws its drive from "life"; life urges and drives one to join with others. One is originally one with others as a child with the mother (102-103). Given Henry's robust sense of life, it cannot be the polis that enables us to know who we are or to create social bonds; such a view has as little to recommend it as Marxism or capitalism.

Here we surely need to distinguish the essential non-sortal core sense of who one is from one's historical-interpersonal sortal identity with which the liberal polis has to do. Similarly (even granting the "original being-in-common" of instinct or "life") how this is historically-socially-culturally shaped and how transcendent others may be significant gracious presences in one's self-discovery and personality development suggest the importance of the polis for determining a social setting that may nourish and foster one's personal and social self. In short, we need to have and be concerned about the structures of the common world.


But we must acknowledge with Henry that the transcendental unique ipseity and self-presence, and the transcendental dignity based on these, is not a self-creation. And to think that it is a creation of the polis or the state verges on "the empire of death." One might say that if we grant this dignity, then we have the foundation of a commonweal that may fend off an "empire of death." But for Henry this hope is not to be founded in any theory of rights or political arrangement. Rather it is founded in the deeper understanding of transcendental life provided by Christianity as sketched in Chapter 13 of I am the Truth (trans., Stanford: 2003), which should be read in conjunction with this book. That there is an I and a plurality of I's, indeed, that there is consciousness, are not self-explanatory. Rather these are meta-facts, i.e., facts that are presupposed by all the others and cannot be accounted for by anything more basic in our experience. But each I's self-givenness, its intimacy, to itself is not a "personal achievement"; rather one's very self-consciousness and intimacy derives from the self-givenness, self-manifestation and self-generation of Life itself. This infinite transcendental divine self-givenness is to be understood as God the Father's generation of ipseities, as unique Sons generated through and with God's Eternal Son.

The form, beginning, and telos of all community, common life, and politics begin immemorially with God's self-manifesting self-generation. The common life together properly begins with explicitly knowing and loving the Father, and knowing and loving oneself and others in and through the eternally begotten Son, in and through whose begetting we are. Human ipseities have forgotten their immemorial birth, identity, and calling as sons in the Son, and no political economy will save them as long as there is this forgetting. When awakened from this forgetting, when living faithfully, our non-sortal dignity as sons or transcendental ipseities trumps all worldly characterizations such as gender, race, talent, class, merit, tradition, etc. With this decisive overcoming of the "world," our life together will be transfigured because informed by the mutual love of Father and Son.