From Conventionalism to Social Authenticity: Heidegger's Anyone and Contemporary Social Theory

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Hans Bernhard Schmid and Gerhard Thonhauser (eds.), From Conventionalism to Social Authenticity: Heidegger's Anyone and Contemporary Social Theory, Springer, 2017, 278pp., $119.99 (hbk), ISBN 9783319568645.

Reviewed by Dermot Moran, Boston College


Despite the growing academic effort to group Martin Heidegger among the "deplorables", or even unmentionables, because of his official affiliation with National Socialism (1933 to 1945 -- he never resigned his membership of the Nazi party), and, especially, because of the explicit anti-Semitism scattered through the recently published Black Notebooks, paradoxically there has never been greater interest in Heidegger's writings, especially among analytic philosophers of mind and action, and cognitive scientists interested in his accounts of enactive, embodied, embedded, intelligent existence.[1] This rise of interest in Heidegger, especially in the USA but increasingly in Europe, can largely be credited to the original creative reading offered by Hubert Dreyfus, who presents Heidegger's analysis of skillful coping as an alternative to various Cartesian, internalist accounts of mindedness and intentional behavior.[2] There is an enormous interest among analytic social philosophers primarily in Heidegger's account of the existential dimensions of human existence -- everydayness, inauthenticity, authenticity, care, moodedness, being-with others in community, and so on.

This collection, edited by Hans-Bernhard Schmid and Gerhard Thonhauser (both of Vienna), shows that new and exciting, broadly 'analytic' interpretations of Heidegger are also emerging in the German-speaking European mainland (where interest in Heidegger had primarily been confined to scholars working on the Gesamtausgabe, edited by Friedrich-Wilhelm von Hermann). The focus is Heidegger's account of anonymous, everyday life in the social world, the a priori dimension (his word is "Existential" -- a kind of living dynamic structural feature, analogous to an Aristotelian 'category') of das Man, anyone, as well as its contrast dimension, namely, the life of authenticity or "ownedness" (Eigentlichkeit), the individual life of sincere, committed action that embraces and fulfils a chosen value. The Heidegger in question is very much the Heidegger of Sein und Zeit (1927), mostly §§ 27 and 60.[3] Beinsteiner and Thomä are exceptions, since they refer to the later Heidegger. This is most emphatically not a book about Heidegger's understanding of the meaning of Being or a discussion of his destructive reading of the history of philosophy, although some contributors do discuss Heidegger in relation to Foucault, Arendt, Sartre, Searle, or Judith Butler, and some touch on his anti-social-democratic leanings as somehow part of his analysis of das Man. The collection includes original papers by established figures such as Hans Bernhard Schmid (Vienna), Mark A. Wrathall (Oxford), Dieter Thomä (St. Gallen), and Kevin Thompson (DePaul), as well as by a range of emerging scholars.

The collection focuses on Heidegger's accounts of inauthentic life absorbed in the community (governed by relatively mindless rule-following or "conventionalism"), and authentic life (often interpreted as precisely a life owned by the individual, hence "ownedness"), a life that is conscious of its being-towards-death, as well as the need to be responsible for one's own decisions and to act on them decisively with a view to one's disclosed possibilities (possibilities that cannot be specified independently of one's own living a life, listening to the call of conscience, and one's own choosing of a hero). Heidegger was not unambiguous in laying out his account of inauthentic (das Man) and authentic existence (Eigentlichkeit).[4] Heidegger's account mostly in § 27 (and § 60 for authentic resoluteness) of Being and Time is compressed, dense, and replete with distinctions that are not elaborated.

In many ways Being and Time (1927) exemplified the Zeitgeist of the times. It is a 'modernist' classic -- an account of human life lived in mass society, a kind of intellectual analogue of the lives of Stephen Daedalus or Bloom in Joyce's Ulysses. It is about life lived in the city, collective life, life in what Heidegger calls Öffentlichkeit, 'publicness'. Often, as Gerhard Thonhauser points out, Heidegger's account of this anonymous, collective life has been interpreted as pejorative. It is after all the life of 'anyone' rather than the account of life of the unique individual, the artist, the genius, the Romantic loner, or just the eccentric oddball. But in fact, as Heidegger constantly reminds us throughout Being and Time, the account of 'inauthentic' life of everyday anyone is not to be interpreted evaluatively or morally but rather ontologically. It is an a priori Existential of being human: "the anyone is the condition of possibility of all human action" (p. 2). Thonhauser writes: "To be socialized in the framework of established modes of intelligibility and regulated modes of comportment is the prerequisite for becoming an agent in one's own right" (ibid.).

First of all and most of the time (Heidegger's zunächst und zumeist, BT 370), humans live following the social rules that they apprehend in some kind of mindless, non-explicit, anonymous manner. 'One' follows the crowd, in getting on and off an airplane, or queuing for a meal in the self-service canteen, or honing one's academic life to get tenure. One is, in a sense, "dispersed" into one's roles. But not all of life is lived in this collective, anonymous, rule-bound modality. There is another side of human existence. For Heidegger, the heart of human existence is not so much cognitive intentionality as care. We endow what we care about with significance: "What is significant is primary" (Das Bedeutsame ist das Primäre).[5] I am the owner and author of my life (and not primarily in the sense of ownership in which I can sell my body or its parts). My life has the dimension of what Heidegger calls Jemeinigkeit, 'mineness'; and 'mineness' can be owned (authenticity) or disowned (das Man, anyone), perhaps not deliberately but precisely by lack of deliberation, one simply falls in with the crowd. It is part of Heidegger's genius that he identifies this 'falling' or 'falling prey' (Verfallen) into the public routine, as also constitutive of human existence. We did not fall from the authentic state, rather our most original state is this falling. Things fall apart, the center cannot hold. That's just life. It also ends, perhaps unexpectedly. Time is of the essence. As Thomä puts it, human existence in everydayness is "marked by a collapse of temporal distinctions, a blending of yesterday, today, and tomorrow" (p. 125). Attempting to bring one's life to wholeness, to 'pull oneself together', to achieve 'self-realization' (as Charles Taylor has put it),[6] is also constitutive of life, something that has a call on one, perhaps motivated by the intolerable experience of meaninglessness, pointlessness, as in existential Angst, boredom, or even in clinical depression, and other such 'fundamental moods' (Grundstimmungen, another original Heideggerian contribution). This dynamic tension in human existence to be or not to be one's genuine self, stripped of all the language of transcendental, phenomenological ontology, is what Heidegger is talking about -- and it is intimately connected with human lived temporality, especially projected futurity. Authentic resoluteness (Entschlossenheit) opens up genuine futural possibilities to be oneself in the form of 'projections'. Resoluteness is, for Heidegger, "the disclosive projection and determination of what is factically possible at the time" (BT, p. 345).

The existential dimensions of inauthenticity and authenticity are issues about how the "self" experiences itself, how it is 'self-related', how it is to overcome a self-satisfaction that imprisons it in habitual everydayness. Fittingly, the first chapter is Wrathall's illuminating essay on what it is to be a self: "to be a self is to be a particular way of making some environmental affordances stand out as more salient than other, and of aligning affordances into coherent trajectories to be followed in pursuing our projects" (p. 9). We are first and foremost always ourselves. Yet we can also be in 'self-alienation'. One can be at a distance from oneself: "I wasn't myself yesterday" (p. 10). Like Heidegger, Wrathall approaches selfhood from various kinds of everyday 'not-I' experiences. He offers a survey of various ways of understanding being-oneself from Locke, to Perry, to Frankfurt and Sartre, and he regards all as more or less compatible, and as addressing something significant about selfhood. However, for Heidegger, the 'I' is not a substance or entity, rather it is a mode of existing. Wrathall summarizes his own position: "I am an anyone-self when my psychological makeup leads me to defer to or conform to conventional ways of understanding myself, the people and things around me, and my situation in the shared public world" (p. 17). The everyday self is the self of social normativity. Its stability is its style (a concept also articulated by Husserl and taken up by Merleau-Ponty). For Heidegger, as we go about our familiar routines, "everyone is the other, and no-one is himself" (BT, p. 128). When the everyday self is in a situation it discloses the public possibilities and 'affordances' (a term from J. J. Gibson that has been embraced by the Dreyfusians) of that situation. On the other hand, in authenticity, Wrathall suggests, when an authentic self is there, the situation is indexed to the person in his or her individuality (p. 18). But how?
Charlotte Knowles (here following Stephen Mulhall[7]) explores how inauthentic everyday life can be transformed (at least temporarily) into authentic existence. She critiques Frederick Olafson,[8] who finds a fundamental tension between the anonymous, social existence of das Man and authentic existence, to the point that he thinks that das Man is not an 'existentiale' of Dasein but rather a deformation of its genuinely social existence. In contrast to Olafson, who wants to downplay das Man, Knowles wants to elevate it to a central position. Knowles and Dreyfus are right. Human beings oscillate between theyness and mineness, but mineness is founded on theyness. I first must already inhabit a style of life before I can creatively adapt and adopt it. Knowles makes the interesting point that being in the 'das Man' mode involves acting in a stereotypical way; authenticity on the other hand, she interprets as a 'struggle over social meanings' (p. 50). She quotes Heidegger perceptively: das Man "keeps watch over everything exceptional that thrusts itself to the fore. Every kind of priority gets noiselessly suppressed" (BT, p. 127).

Jo-Jo Koo focuses on Heidegger's characterization of the das Man existentiale as indifferent or 'undistinguished', a particular mode of 'unownedness'. Living in an undistinguished, average way is socialized as 'normal' and hence difference is suppressed. Koo wants to distinguish 'undistinguishedness' from 'disownedness' and 'ownedness' as a kind of middle state in order to make room for ways humans can distinguish themselves authentically by 'leaping in' for others, as Heidegger puts it. As Koo admits, there is little textual evidence to support his proposed distinction. Indistinguishedness is, as Koo suggests, part of Dasein's habitus; but it is not, as he thinks, a third existentiale between authenticity and inauthenticity.

Andreas Beinsteiner takes his orientation from Dreyfus's interpretation of Heidegger, whereby action depends on an implicit understanding of shared social norms. Dreyfus emphasized that das Man has a tendency towards conformity. Beinsteiner puts Heidegger's normativity into dialogue with Foucault's analysis of power-structures, draws attention to a subtle distinction Heidegger makes between 'the degree of penetration' (Eindringlichkeit), how dominant the anyone is in a certain society, and the 'explicitness' (Ausdrücklichkeit) of the dominance of the anyone. This, he says, anticipates Foucault's discussion of the difference between the ways rules are followed in modernity, by a kind of capacity (and aptitude) and acquiescence rather than by explicit repressive coercion. Beinsteiner's essay is valuable not only for its expert familiarity with the texts of Heidegger but also for its willingness to challenge Dreyfus' reading -- for example, of the role of language in relation to absorbed coping (p. 94 n. 20).

Thompson also puts Heidegger in Auseinandersetzung with Foucault, this time in relation to Foucault's discussions of ways of dealing with life in emerging science, namely, docility -- the disciplining of the body, and optimality -- the "biopolitics" of the society (p. 105). These, according to Thompson, are for Foucault historical dispositions or modes of comportment. Thompson claims that although Heidegger did explore specific historical attunements, "such as wonder in antiquity, and boredom, despair, anxiety, fright, and awe in modernity . . . Foucault's analyses of docility and optimality offer us a much richer, more determinate account of epochal dispositional attunements" (p. 113). This essay rightfully highlights the role of Grundstimmungen and historicality (missing from any other contributions in this volume), but perhaps strains Foucault's terms by interpreting them in Heideggerian ways.

Thomä's scholarly chapter relates Heidegger to Hegel and Diderot on the topics of "alienation" (Entfremdung) and "habit" (Gewohnheit). Thomä claims that Heidegger's description of habit is close to Diderot's and Hegel's accounts of "type" or "espèce". Hegel warns of the danger of someone developing their particularity to the extent of becoming a 'type' (adapting Diderot's espèce). A person weds himself or herself to a style and thereby restricts his or her life. In ordinary English, if one says someone is a right "character", it is very close to saying one has become a "caricature". One way to live is to become the type, the "Goth", or whatever (chosen from a large array of types offered in commercial Öffentlichkeit), and this very individualization is actually a loss of self. As Heidegger puts it there is the "comfortableness of the accustomed" (Behagen in der Gewohnheit). Self-alienation is the antidote to this self-satisfaction, but it too is on the way to a higher resolution in self-consciousness. Thomä rightly points out that, for Heidegger, the capacity to question is the beginning of the breakthrough to self-distantiation. Thomä also points out that Heidegger prioritises the individual's struggle to achieve authenticity, "the factical life of the individual". Heideggerian transcendence is radical individualization.

Ileana Borţun contextualizes Heidegger's das Man in relation to Hannah Arendt's more positive appreciation of "common sense" (she could also have invoked Gadamer), interpreted as the pre-linguistic common understanding that is shared when speaking and acting together. Although Arendt and Heidegger are often contrasted, Borţun finds their views compatible: Heidegger's few remarks about authentic being-with-one-another (Miteinandersein), characterized by care for the other (Fürsorge), still allow respect for the other's individuality in a way Arendt would approve of (p. 134). Borţun argues that because authentic self-understanding is disclosure of plurality, although she acknowledges Heidegger's text is ambiguous. But resolute Dasein can be socially engaged and embedded in its world (see BT, p. 298), although Heidegger has little to say about authentic being-with-one-another, other than that resolute Dasein can become the conscience of the other. Borţun rightly shows (see p. 141) that Heidegger does acknowledge complex structures of Mitsein including 'co-disposedness' (Mitbefindlichkeit) and co-understanding (Mitverstehen) that clearly can be experienced in authentic ways.

Katrin Meyer also discusses Arendt's heterodox adaption of Heidegger's das Man in her account of 'acting in concert', drawing in part on Arendt's private notes.[9] Meyer singles out Heidegger's remark about the 'dictatorship' (BT 164; SZ 126) of das Man in terms of the urge to conform. She offers the following interpretation: "it is the publicness of the democratic mass society of the Weimar Republic in the 1920s Germany that Heidegger has in mind when he points out that public life goes hand in hand with the pressure to conform" (p. 158). This is possibly true, but it is probably the mass society element rather than the democratic element which Heidegger is questioning. Indeed this is similar to Arendt's critique of Bourgeois society in The Human Condition, 1958 (or, Heidegger's student, Herbert Marcuse's One-Dimensional Man, 1964 -- not mentioned here). Arendt interprets self-alienation as only one deficient mode of Mitsein that can be remediated by 'communicative freedom' (p. 163). Arendt confines conformist das Man to the realm of labor, not that of action, which is both plural and free. However, Meyer does not discuss in detail how human communicativity and 'action' is supposed to be liberating. How does it not end up being (like most academic discussions) an endless talking-shop, punctuated at best by comfort breaks?

Lucilla Guidi also addresses Arendt's critique of Heidegger's das Man in relation to their respective readings of Aristotle's ethics on the distinction between production (poesis) and action (praxis) as two different ways to "perform" (Vollzugsweise) the self and world-disclosure. Heidegger's 1924 -- 5 lectures on Aristotle were attended by Arendt. For Heidegger, praxis and poeisis are two ways of disclosing the truth about the world. Guidi emphasizes the importance of world-disclosure in Heidegger; in part being-in-das Man covers up this disclosure through a kind of self-assurance; whereas 'uncanniness' (Unheimlichkeit), literally "not being at home", releases it. Guidi's discussion is interesting in its discussion of building (a house) as a complex activity that is more than production and can be the enabling of authentic existence (Heidegger's dwelling). The essays on Arendt probably tell us more about Arendt than about Heidegger but are valuable in showing the early influence of Heidegger's conception.

Christian Schmidt addresses the issue of how to bring about social change, linking John Searle's concept of Background to Heidegger's das Man. Das Man conventionality is not the result of any collective agreements (p. 209).

Schmid offers a nuanced and valuable analysis of the nature of social roles (drawing on Mead and Goffman), asking whether Heidegger can be understood as a conventionalist -- the self is constituted by its social roles and normativity -- a view defended by Dreyfus, Brandom, and Haugeland. Schmid shows that being oneself, for Heidegger, is often in opposition to one's social role. Heidegger is, therefore, not a conventionalist. Furthermore, authenticity or inauthenticity is not a matter of embracing or rejecting a social role. Self-identity is not role identity (p. 269). Interestingly, and accurately, Schmid believes Heidegger locates the selfhood of Dasein in its mood or affectivity (Befindlichkeit).

It is really going against Heidegger's explicit intention to single out selected aspects of the existential analytic of Dasein and treat it as a philosophical sourcebook of ideas about human sociality. Heidegger himself, in his Letter on Humanism, warns that his account of das Man was not meant as a contribution to sociology![10] The strength of this collection lies in its fine-grained and multifaceted exploration of everydayness with its modalities of inauthenticity and authenticity. Inevitably, some contributors (e.g. Koo, p. 54) think of Heidegger's description of das Man as pejorative, and some also, despite Heidegger's claim to be doing ontology, want to read a certain morality into das Man (for Knowles, it perpetrates stereotypes; for Koo, it eliminates distinctive differences). It is worth recalling that, for Heidegger: "The 'they' is an existentiale and as a primordial phenomenon, it belongs to Dasein's positive constitution" (Das Man ist ein Existential und gehört als ursprüngliches Phänomen zur positive Verfassung des Daseins, BT, p. 167; SZ 129). The whole discussion of das Man takes place within a chapter dealing with Mitsein and Selbstsein, being-with others and being-oneself. Das Man, for Heidegger, is characterized by three main features -- 'distantiality' (Abständigkeit), 'averageness' (Durchschnittlichkeit), and 'levelling down' (Einebnung, see BT, p. 165). This collection explicates and clarifies das Man, but few contributors (aside from Beinsteiner and Koo) take up explicitly these three features and give them clarification. Furthermore, the nature of authenticity is left unclear -- although Schmid and others point to the fact that human existence is its potentiality. There is no formula for authenticity, no categorical imperative that can be invoked. Heidegger is not offering any moral guide to the good life. Rather he is articulating the necessary structures that formally make a life inauthentic or authentic. It is a pity there was not more attention to what resoluteness signifies. There is inevitably a degree of repetition among the contributors. It would have been better (but no doubt would have delayed the volume significantly), if each contributor had read the other contributions and cross-referenced. This minor carp aside, it is an excellent and timely collection, bringing renewed interpretative vigor to key sections of Heidegger's classic.

[1] See, for instance, Julian Kiverstein and Michael Wheeler, eds., Heidegger and Cognitive Science (London: Palgrave-Macmillan 2012); and Jon Robson, "Heidegger and Analytic Philosophy: Together at Last?" International Journal of Philosophical Studies 22 (3) (2014):482 -- 87.

[2] Hubert L. Dreyfus, Being-in-the-World. A Commentary on Heidegger's Being in Time, Division I (Cambridge, MA: MIT Press, 1990).

[3] Martin Heidegger, Sein und Zeit (1927), 17th ed. (Tübingen: Max Niemeyer, 1993. Hereafter 'SZ' followed by page number of the English translation); Being and Time, trans. J. Macquarrie & E. Robinson (San Francisco/Oxford: Harper & Row/Basil Blackwell, 1962). Hereafter 'BT' followed by page number of the English translation.

[4] Taylor Carman thinks Heidegger contradicts himself. See his "On Being Social: A Reply to Olafson" Inquiry, 37 (1994), 203 -- 223.

[5] Martin Heidegger, Zur Bestimmung der Philosophie, Gesamtausgabe 56/57 (Frankfurt am Main: Klostermann, 1987), p. 73; trans. by Ted Sadler, Towards the Definition of Philosophy (London & NY: Continuum, 2000).

[6] Charles Taylor, The Ethics of Authenticity (Cambridge: Harvard University Press, 1992).

[7] Stephen Mulhall, Inheritance and Originality: Wittgenstein, Heidegger, Kierkegaard (Oxford: Clarendon Press, 2001).

[8] Frederick A. Olafson, "Heidegger à la Wittgenstein or 'Coping' with Professor Dreyfus," Inquiry: An Interdisciplinary Journal of Philosophy, 37(1) (1994), 45 -- 6.

[9] Hannah Arendt, Denktagebuch. 1950 -- 1973, ed. U. Ludz & I. Nordmann, 2 vols. (München/Zürich: Piper, 2002).

[10] M. Heidegger, "Letter on Humanism," Pathmarks (New York: Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1998), pp. 242 -- 43.