From Current Algebra to Quantum Chromodynamics: A Case for Structural Realism

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Tian Yu Cao, From Current Algebra to Quantum Chromodynamics: A Case for Structural Realism, Cambridge University Press, 2010, 308pp., $85.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780521889339.

Reviewed by Meinard Kuhlmann, University of Bremen


Cao's book is the first part of a larger project about the formation of quantum chromodynamics [QCD]. (The second part of Cao's project is a detailed historical study, called The Making of QCD, which is not covered by this review.) This theory is an important part of the Standard Model of particle physics and covers the strong force or 'color force', accounting for the cohesion of the nucleus despite the electrostatic repulsion of its constituent protons. The emergence of QCD in the 1960s and early 70s was a glorious period in modern physics, with spectacular predictive successes based on ideas about the fundamental symmetries with an unprecedented speculative nature. It suggested that something radically new had happened, which turned our established ontology and methodology around. It seemed that somehow symmetries as such entered the center stage of physics and that everything else follows from the fundamental symmetries. But what exactly does this mean, methodologically and ontologically? This is what Cao explores in great conceptual and historical detail, with the intention to offer a reading of the developments in terms of structural realism.

If one understands structural realism as the claim that structures, or nets of relations, exist and play a crucial role in scientific inquiries, then Cao offers a convincing defense. For modern physics in particular, structural considerations in terms of symmetries were pivotal in the discovery of quarks and other fundamental constituents of the physical world. But who wants to deny that? So does Cao make any stronger claim that deserves the name structural realism? Does he make a case in favor of epistemic structural realism, by showing that we can only have knowledge about structures? Or does he even make the very strong ontological claim that all that exists are structures -- the eliminative version of ontic structural realism? Or the weaker and more widespread, but still controversial, claim that although not all that exists are structures, they nevertheless have ontological priority in some sense -- which is the non-eliminative version of ontic structural realism. Surprisingly, Cao makes none of these claims. So, to put it briefly, Cao does not make a case in favor of structural realism, if it is understood in any sense that is not completely uncontroversial. Thus most readers will find the title of Cao's book to be misleading. Someone who is looking for arguments in favor of structural realism on the basis of quantum field theory [QFT] will largely be disappointed. Nevertheless, Cao has interesting things to say about the history, methodology and interpretation of one of the most fascinating parts of QFT.

The most spectacular and widely known aspect of QCD is the postulation of quarks by, among others, the enigmatic American physicist Murray Gell-Mann in 1964 and the gradual empirical confirmation of their existence in the following decades up to 1995, when the last quark, the top quark, was taken to be "observed". Already in 1961, Gell-Mann (and independently Ne'eman) had proposed the notorious "eightfold way", according to which there is an abstract symmetry -- specified by the special unitary group SU(3) -- that allows for a neat classification of the increasingly anarchic particle zoo, which housed some 100 "fundamental" particles in the 1950s. The proposed classification entailed the introduction of three new kinds of charges for the strongly interacting particles, or "hadrons" (e.g., protons and neutrons), on a par with the one electromagnetic charge in quantum electrodynamics. Although these charges are called "color charges", there is no more than a loose analogy to the three colors red, green and blue which are perceptible by humans. Only later it turned out that in fact one needs six color charges, corresponding to six types of quarks. Gell-Mann also introduced the notion of current algebra, which is formed by the operators for the hadron currents between initial and final hadron states in scattering experiments. The current algebra became a very popular tool in the 1960s because it allowed making predictions without having a reliable model for the underlying dynamics.

At the time when quarks were first postulated, it was by no means clear whether they should actually be viewed as real constituents of hadrons or rather, as Gell-Mann saw it for a long time, as mathematical devices in order to represent certain observed symmetries. And there is one peculiarity of quarks in particular which seems to exclude viewing them as real particles, namely, quark confinement. Unlike the other forces, the strong force between quarks gets stronger with larger separation instead of diminishing. This entails that it would require an infinite amount of energy to separate two quarks, so that quarks can never exist as free particles but are always confined to composites with further quarks. Only in 1969 was there strong evidence for quarks as real fundamental constituents of matter in experiments with deep inelastic scattering of electrons and protons performed at Stanford's National Accelerator Laboratory (SLAC).

As Cao emphasizes, particle physics underwent a radical change of its fundamental ontology between the 1950s and the early 1970s. In the mid 1950s roughly 100 hadrons, amongst them the proton and the neutron, were known; and it was believed that they were all equally fundamental: "nuclear democracy" or "hadronic egalitarianism" was the consensus. That view was to change radically in the period that Cao studies in the present book: with the formulation of QCD in 1972-73, none of the hadrons was taken as fundamental any more. Instead, far fewer particles were seen as really fundamental constituents, namely only a few kinds of quarks, besides gluons, which mediate the strong interaction and which are themselves charged, unlike photons, the mediators of the electromagnetic force.

Cao's crucial point about these developments is the role of symmetries in the construction of theories. As he emphasizes in chapter 2 -- see in particular sections 2.3 and 2.4 -- the SU(3) symmetry in Gell-Mann's eightfold way was understood as an abstract symmetry since it does not directly refer to "elementary" (fermionic) baryons.  These, along with the (bosonic) mesons make up the hadrons, which feel the strong force. One, if not the main, result of Cao's analysis of the ensuing development appears at the end of chapter 7. Here, he concludes that Gell-Mann went through a fundamental change regarding his conception of physical reality. In the beginning

he took an algebraic structure of the world, assumed by current algebra and confirmed by many observations, as more real than the hypothetic world of quarks and gluons. When QCD was at hand, he "clarified" his view and . . . took the world of quarks and color octet gluons as more real than the algebraic structure abstracted from it. (p. 158)

Cao goes on to generalize that such a conversion "just fits into the general pattern" (p. 158) of the construction of theories. Thus in his view, structural knowledge, expressed by empirically confirmed symmetries, is often all one has in certain periods of research. However, eventually the role of structural insights is to lead the way to theories of a deeper level of reality, with fundamental objects, such as quarks and gluons, which constitute the ultimate ontology of the physical world.

Before pondering in more detail the message that results from Cao's case study, I wish to briefly mention some possible obstacles for readers. Cao's book is explicitly "not intended to be a popular exposition" (p. 2) of the conceptual history of the emergence of QCD. Nor, one must add, is it a particularly accessible exposition of structural realism. In order to profit from Cao's book you will need to come to terms with a lot of lingo and you should have a firm grip on both QCD and the ramifications of the debate about realism, including, in particular, the position of structural realism. If you don't, you will most likely be lost. For both issues, crucial basic arguments and positions are often not introduced in a clear, intelligible and recognizable way and/or they appear much too late (e.g., current algebra on p. 33). Moreover, the presentation is sometimes confusing and non-conclusive. Putnam appears as the arch anti-realist and is associated with the "pessimistic induction" (p. 4), whereas Larry Laudan, who should be foremost associated with "pessimistic metainduction", is not even mentioned, nor is Putnam's famous no-miracles argument in favor of realism. In general, the exposition often meanders from position to position without a clearly discernible aim or structure. Apart from the fact that this makes the reading tedious it has the more serious disadvantage that it is often pretty hard to recognize Cao's own point of view. A last shortcoming is that Cao takes hardly any notice of the literature after 2003, in particular the vibrant debate between eliminative and non-eliminative ontic structural realists, which is clearly relevant for his study.

So what does Cao show? He calls the version of structural realism he advocates constructive structural realism -- and takes it to be a third option besides epistemic and ontic structural realism. Here are "two of its basic assumptions":

(i) the physical world consists of entities that are all structured and/or involved in larger structures; and (ii) entities of any kind can be approached through their internal and external structural properties and relations that are epistemically accessible to us. (p. 6)

Unfortunately, this is not very helpful, because it is hard to recognize any clear and interesting claims. Has assumption (i) got anything specific to do with structural realism? It seems that a traditional realist would have no problem agreeing. And the same applies to assumption (ii), which is very vague. Does "can be approached" mean that this is one among other ways? Also, is "that are epistemically accessible to us" taken to mean only they are epistemically accessible to us? And, finally, what does the expression "internal and external structural properties and relations" mean? Are there internal structural properties and also internal structural relations? I find it very hard to understand what exactly Cao wants to say.

Cao continues with the clearer statement that the "core idea [of constructive structural realism] that differentiates it from other versions of structural realism is that the reality of unobservable entity can be inferred from the reality of structure." (p. 6) Thus Cao's constructive structural realism -- let's call it CSR -- deviates from the current ontic version of structural realism (OSR) by maintaining the traditional view that the fundamental ontology consists of objects. (A short note on terminology: Cao speaks of 'entity ontology' to label a conception on which things or 'substances' or objects are basic. I follow the expedient practice in ontology of using the expression 'entity' as its most general term. Thus things, properties, structures, states of affairs, or anything else you consider including in your ontology are entities, although, of course, different kinds of entities. In order to have a uniform terminology, I use the expression 'object' -- which is unequivocal in the present context -- where Cao talks about 'entity'.)

Calling CSR a third option besides epistemic and ontic structural realism may sound like an alternative between the latter two, i.e., ESR and OSR. This is not the case, however: CSR is not only less revisionary, and in this sense weaker, than OSR -- for CSR does not dispense with (the priority of) objects -- but it is also weaker than ESR, since CSR does not claim that we can only know structures. Thus CSR makes no new ontological claim, and it also makes no claim regarding the limits of our knowledge.

However, if nothing else, CSR does make a methodological claim. Cao's crucial point is that "fundamental ontology is historically constructed from available structural knowledge of reality" (p. 7). And a bit later he links this general point to his case study about the successful application of current algebra by pointing out that

if we interpret the Lie algebra in terms of physical structures, taking electromagnetic and weak currents as its representations, then we have physical content, but only at the phenomenological level. In order to understand the physical structures (the currents) properly, we have to move deeper onto the level of their constituents (hadrons or quarks) and their dynamics (p. 7).

Now that's a bit thick for the staunch structural realist! Not only do objects exist and are ontologically prior to structures, physical structures cannot even be fully understood without referring to a deeper level of objects. Therefore, according to Cao it is not only the case that there is more to know than structures, but (physical) structures as such cannot even be properly understood unless one infers and thus specifies the objects that underlie these structures (also see p. 226f). Now we have in Cao's own words a lot of what the critics of structural realism have objected all along.

Although Cao's position is thus a far cry from what current ontic structural realists in particular would like to see for QFT, maybe this is what the insights that motivated structural realism boil down to at the end of the day. And the upshot is this: structural considerations, centered on invariances expressed by symmetry groups, were crucial for the theoretical development of QFT and for the discovery of its unobservable fundamental ontology (quarks, gluons etc.). However, this entails neither that all there is are structures nor that structures are ontologically prior to objects, nor does it mean that we can only know structures. Structural approaches in the sciences, such as the application of Gell-Mann's current algebra in the 1960s, are "merely" highly valuable for the construction of theories and the discovery of the unobservable objects on the fundamental level of reality.

Thus which philosophers may profit from Cao's book in the end? I can see two antipodal camps. One camp is the critics of structural realism, for Cao offers a detailed historical argument against all those versions of structural realism that are currently discussed. The other camp may actually be advocates of structural realism because Cao supplies them with a wealth of potentially relevant material. However, when it comes to making "a case for structural realism", they will be better off not relying on Cao and should instead find their own arguments.