From Empedocles to Wittgenstein: Historical Essays in Philosophy

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Anthony Kenny, From Empedocles to Wittgenstein: Historical Essays in Philosophy, Oxford University Press, 2008, 218pp., $60.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199550821.

Reviewed by Owen Goldin, Marquette University


From Empedocles to Wittgenstein is a collection of essays written by Kenny during the last few years. In his preface Kenny tells us that most are attempts to justify somewhat controversial positions taken in his introductory A New History of Western Philosophy.[1] Most, but not all, have been previously published; some have been revised for this collection. As the title declares, all have their source in issues in the history of philosophy. Together they document the most recent phase in the evolution of the thought of one of the most significant philosophers working today.

"Seven Concepts in Creation" offers a synoptic view of the philosophic contours of what Kenny identifies as the seven major concepts of creation found in the Western tradition: "the Platonic concept, the Mosaic concept, the Augustinian concept, the Avicennan concept, the Thomist concept, the Scotist concept, and the Cartesian concept" (12). Kenny presents a taxonomy of these by way of seven aspects of those accounts: what they say of the nature of the creator, what existed prior to creation, whether there was a blueprint for creation (and if so, what it was), the reason for creation, the things created, and when creation took place. This short piece provides a lens by which to understand the possible responses to the problems that the Timaeus raises, and some new angles by which to trace the development of what was for centuries a major metaphysical theme.

"Life after Etna" is an entertaining survey of literary treatments of Empedocles' fabled leap into Mt. Etna.

"Virtue and the Good in Plato and Aristotle" is a revision of a response to T. H. Irwin's "Glaucon's Challenge: Does Aristotle Change His Mind?,"[2] originally published with that paper. Irwin attempted a developmental account of Aristotelian ethics, from Magna Moralia, Eudemian Ethics, and Nicomachean Ethics, on the basis of Aristotle's changing responses to nine fundamental ethical theses Irwin found in Plato. There is no space here to work these through. Suffice it to say that Kenny takes issue with some of Irwin's claims concerning the stances the three works take in regard to each thesis; it is no surprise that Kenny's results support his longstanding view that the Magna Moralia is philosophically akin to the Eudemian Ethics (even if, as Kenny believes, it was not written by Aristotle), and that the Eudemian Ethics is the later, more philosophically mature of Aristotle's two ethical works. Kenny's insights on Aristotelian ethics are always valuable, but this paper works best as a supplement to Irwin's detailed analyses; when read alone, it is not clear why it is just these points that Kenny addresses; as Kenny admits, they are not necessarily points that Aristotle would identify as central to or constitutive of his ethical theory.

"Aristotle's Criteria of Happiness" originated as a response to John Cooper's "Plato and Aristotle on 'Finality' and '(Self)-Sufficiency'"[3] in which Cooper famously reversed himself and showed how Aristotle did indeed identify contemplation as the final good. Cooper's strategy was to see Aristotle as responding to the conditions for the supreme good found in Plato's Philebus: it must be both final and complete (teleios) and self-sufficient. Influenced by the work of his student G. R. Lear, Cooper showed how the life of virtuous practical activity could constitute a true good in itself, even if the ultimate good were contemplative activity: the former instantiates the same characteristics as the latter, by virtue of which it is "good," albeit in a less perfect manner. Kenny agrees with Cooper, and, in the revised version included here, with Lear, whose insights have since been published.[4] Kenny argues that Cooper and Lear's case for their understanding of Aristotle's thought on the supreme human good would have been strengthened had they more fully appreciated what the Eudemian Ethics says on these issues.

"Practical Truth in Aristotle" is an attempt to become clear on the phrase alētheia praktikē at NE 1139a26-7. Against Anscombe[5] and others, Kenny argues that the bearer of practical truth, like that of theoretical truth, is thought or speech. The difference is that practically true thought and speech are concerned with the particulars with which one's own actions are concerned, and are oriented towards one's own good (and accordingly involve general premises concerning the good). Practical truth does not guarantee ethical action, for it must be conjoined with right desire in order to result in proairesis ("resolution") and the consequent action, and such desire is not in itself a result of the practical reasoning at issue.

"Aristotle's Categories and the Latin Fathers" is a review of the evidence concerning the study of Aristotle's account of the categories of being by the Church Fathers of the fourth century. Kenny offers an argument that Augustine was aware of Aristotle's account via the work Decem Categoriae which was falsely attributed to him, but whose true author, Kenny argues, could well have been Victorinus.

"Essence and Existence: Aquinas and Islamic Philosophy" presents in a condensed manner a number of the historical and philosophical analyses offered in Aquinas on Being, an indictment of Aquinas on multiple charges of philosophical confusion. Scholars working in the area will want to consult the fuller work, but this essay serves well as an introduction to Kenny's important criticisms.

"Aquinas on the Beginning of Human Life" revisits the ethics of abortion and the use of fetal stem cells, issues which Kenny first addressed in "Abortion and the Taking of Human Life."[6] (The two papers arrive at the same conclusion; they differ insofar as the first situates Kenny's argument in the context of his metaethics, while the second offers it as a correction to the perspective of Aquinas.) The crucial question, from Kenny's perspective, is the time at which we can say, not that life begins, but that the individual human being begins. He lays out and rejects the answer of Aquinas, according to whom the father's semen is present and active for forty days; only then, when the sensitive soul is complete, is the intellectual soul infused, and a human life begins. Kenny argues that this view is untenable since it rests on a faulty account of what each parent contributes to generation. In contrast to Aquinas, Kenny thinks that the argument must be led by everyday beliefs as reflected in everyday language. Because one can legitimately say "if my mother had had an abortion six months into her pregnancy, she would have killed me" one can reasonably infer that at six months the "me" in question would have been an existing person with a valid claim to life. But the fertilized egg is not yet individualized, since there is a period of two weeks during which it could have split into two, resulting in twins. Accordingly, one could not legitimately say "if my mother had had an abortion a week into her pregnancy, she would have killed me" for, without such individualization, there was not yet a "me." Kenny concludes that abortion is impermissible at around the fourteenth day of pregnancy. Kenny's argument is striking in its simplicity and originality; his position deserves as much debate and consideration as do the other leading philosophical treatments of the issue. Its appeal is that it rests on how most people would speak, avoiding theological and problematic metaphysical theses. (Still, metaphysical problems linger below the surface. For example, the cellular processes behind the formation of monozygotic twins are increasingly understood, and research is underway to develop means to prevent this from occurring.[7] Suppose that such research were successful, and means were employed to, for example, prevent the blastocyst from suffering collapse. In such a case, would individual human life begin at conception? An argument that this is not so would need to appeal to notions like "natural potentiality" that are notoriously problematic, and that in this context Kenny apparently wishes to avoid, instead relying on shared cultural understanding and linguistic practice.)

"Thomas and Thomism" is an overview (with historical background) of the varieties of Thomism today. Kenny champions a "critical Thomism" which accepts, among other insights, the crucial interdependence of actualization and individuation without buying into Aquinas' confusions through deference to authority. It concludes with a touching tribute to Norman Kretzmann, fellow critical Thomist. This is followed by "Aquinas in America," a review article of two books by Kretzmann's students: Robert Pasnau's Thomas Aquinas on Human Nature[8] and Eleanore Stump's Aquinas.[9]

"'Philosophy states only what everyone admits'" is devoted to the assertion of Wittgenstein (PI 599) that serves as its title. In contrast to commentators like Hacker and Hallett, Kenny argues that Wittgenstein means what he says. According to Wittgenstein, philosophical arguments are at best part of a therapy by which a thesis is shown to be nonsense through the drawing out of nonsensical conclusions. The positive claims that philosophers make are indeed reminders of what everyone already knows; again, this is in the service of a therapy meant to cure one who holds nonsensical dogmas. Kenny admits that Wittgenstein's practice as a philosopher does not always conform to this view; Wittgenstein seems to make a number of important substantive points concerning the nature and workings of language. Kenny takes this to be a deep tension inherent in Wittgenstein's thought. I could not help relating this account of Wittgenstein to Kenny's own practice in "Aquinas on the Beginning of Human Life," which begins from "what everyone admits" but which leads to an ethical conclusion that would be admitted by neither of the ethical communities which have taken strong stands on the ethics of abortion. What are the contours of the disagreement between Kenny and Wittgenstein, here? Or do they not disagree at all concerning what philosophical argument can and should do? It is an unfortunate limitation of the genre "collection of papers" that no answer is offered to such a question, which arises when the book is read straight through.

"Cognitive Scientism" takes its start from Kenny's vote of approval for M. R. Bennett and P. M. S. Hacker's, Philosophical Foundations of Neuroscience,[10] which argues from a Wittgensteinian perspective that the problem of consciousness, as generally understood by cognitive scientists, is infested with Cartesian confusion. Kenny supports this with Aristotelian tools. The mind is a "capacity," which is not only to be distinguished from its possessor (the human being) but also from what Kenny calls its "vehicle," what Aristotle would call the kath' hauto ("in itself") substrate of the capacity. According to Kenny, mind cannot be reduced to the brain, for a capacity cannot be reduced to its vehicle. The identity of the vehicle for mind is a matter for empirical investigation; as Wittgenstein said, the discovery after his death that his skull was empty would not call into question his former possession of a mind. Kenny declares that the proper work of cognitive science is the investigation of the identities of the vehicle for mental capacities. I applaud the return to Aristotle here, but fear that the traditional problems of cognitive science cannot be dissolved so easily. Aristotle holds that it is the essence of a substrate that determines which capacities it has, qua being that substrate. Thus, although the capacity of fire to heat is empirically discovered, one with a completely adequate scientific grasp of what fire is would see that it is necessary that it has the capacity to heat. Likewise, to take a more complicated case, one with a completely adequate scientific grasp of the celestial bodies, their motions, and light would see it is necessary that an eclipse, with certain features, sometimes occur; astronomy does more than simply say that the moon, sun, and earth are the vehicles for the capacity to occlude light. Aristotle would say the same concerning the brain and mental capacities. For the nervous system to be the vehicle of mental capacities, one with an adequate scientific grasp of the former would understand why the latter must follow. But contemporary neuroscience takes cellular biology to in principle tell the whole story concerning what the nervous system is, and it is not clear that all mental capacities are necessitated by the nature of this system, as cellular biology currently understands it. Accordingly, even on the path that Kenny advocates, the traditional problems of philosophy of mind reproduce themselves.

"The Wittgenstein Editions" tells the troubled tale of the publication history of the Wittgenstein Nachlass, a story in which Kenny himself plays a principle role. The different sides of the story have already been publicly told; perhaps this republication of Kenny's account will stand as the last word. As one who is not a Wittgenstein scholar, I stand outside the fray, but offer as my reaction "What a mess." I also express my gratitude that at last scholars now have access to accurate versions of the material and are able to trace the complex history in how it was arranged.

The volume concludes with two papers in which Kenny shares his current stand on matters of faith. In "Knowledge, Belief, and Faith" Kenny professes agnosticism. Religious belief can be reasonable, as long as it is not based on a revelation available only to some. Although religious affiliation plays an important social role, religious narratives need to be reserved for the "poetry section of one's mind."

"The Unity of Knowledge and the Diversity of Belief" offers a historical overview of positions concerning the afterlife. Kenny tells us that he cannot conceive of a life following the dissolution of the body, and is grieved not by the prospect of nonexistence but by the inevitable parting of friends.

Those new to Kenny's thought will find that these papers offer an ideal first path into his comprehensive, careful, and clearheaded work. Those already familiar with his writings will be entertained and enlightened by these occasional pieces from the most recent phase of Kenny's distinguished career.

[1] Oxford: Clarendon Press: 2004-7.

[2] In R. Heinaman, ed. Plato and Aristotle's Ethics (Aldershot, Hampshire: 2003), 87-108.

[3] In Heinaman. 117-47.

[4] G. R. Lear, Happy Lives and the Highest Good: An Essay on Aristotle's Nicomachean Ethics (Princeton: Princeton University Press, 2004).

[5] E. Anscombe, "Thought and Action in Aristotle," in J. R. Bambrough, New Essays in Plato and Aristotle (London: Routledge & Kegan Paul, 1965), 143-58.

[6] In A. Kenny, Reason and Religion: Essays in Philosophical Theology (Oxford: Basil Blackwell), 1987.

[7] K. I. Aston, C. M. Peterson, and D. T. Carrell, "Monozygotic twinning associated with assisted reproductive technologies: a review," Reproduction 136 (2008): 377-386.

[8] R. Pasnau, Thomas Aquinas on Human Nature: A Philosophical Study of Summa Theologiae, 1a 75-89 (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2001).

[9] E. Stump, Aquinas (The Arguments of the Philosophers) (London and New York: Routeledge, 2003).

[10] Oxford: Blackwell, 2003.