From Empiricism to Expressivism: Brandom Reads Sellars

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Robert B. Brandom, From Empiricism to Expressivism: Brandom Reads Sellars, Harvard University Press, 2015, 289pp., $35.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780674187283.

Reviewed by Mark Okrent, Bates College


In his remarkable new collection of essays, Robert Brandom successfully carries out two related, but difficult, tasks. First, by approaching the notoriously challenging work of Wilfrid Sellars by way of Sellars' appropriation of Kant, Brandom succeeds in giving a clear exposition of central themes in Sellars' work and in showing how and why that work remains important for contemporary philosophical concerns. But of equal importance, Brandom also succeeds in laying out a significant expressivist account of the nature and status of modal language, an account that clearly has Kantian and Sellarsian roots but just as clearly bears a distinctively Brandomian stamp.

Right at the beginning, Brandom correctly notes that Sellars was "distinguished from his fellow analysts of the time both by his overtly systematic ambitions and by the self-consciously historical roots of his thought." (p.1) The same can be said with equal justice of Brandom. Everything that he writes has a place within his system. And everything that he writes is informed by his learned, idiosyncratic, and sympathetic reading of the history of philosophy. This historical rootedness is sometimes merely implicit in Brandom's work, but often, as here, his own positions are delineated in and through his engagement with the past. For what is on offer in this set of essays that are presumptively about Sellars are Brandom's own philosophical positions, developed and articulated through his illuminating reading of Sellars' reading of Kant.

So what important ideas does Brandom think that Sellars derived from his reading of Kant? He identifies two, one of which he endorses, one of which he rejects. The first idea, which Brandom wholeheartedly endorses, is essentially a twentieth century reworking of the Kantian notion that there are, in addition to empirical concepts, also an important class of special, non-empirical concepts, the categories:

[Sellars] gives a metalinguistic reading of Kant's thought that, besides concepts used in empirical description and explanation, there are also concepts whose expressive role it is to make explicit necessary features of the framework that makes empirical description and explanation possible. (p. 2)

Although most of the volume is devoted to developing this first idea, there are several reasons to start with the second idea that Brandom thinks Sellars derived from Kant. This is the suggestion that the best way to understand the commitments entailed by a robust scientific realism is in terms of an updated version of Kant's distinction between phenomena and noumena. The first reason to start here is that Brandom's argument for rejecting this Sellarsian version of Kant's distinction is subtle and importantly relevant to contemporary issues that only indirectly relate to Kant or Sellars' work. A second reason is that this subtle argument crucially depends upon a principle that performs multiple functions in this volume, including underpinning the other (from Brandom's standpoint) good idea that Sellars derived from Kant. This is the principle that Brandom styles the 'modal Kant-Sellars thesis':

every empirical descriptive concept has modal consequences. That is, its correct application has necessary conditions that would be expressed explicitly using subjunctive conditionals, and hence depends on what is true in other possible worlds besides the one in which it is being applied. (p. 67)

In a telling passage that Brandom quotes from Science and Metaphysics, Sellars explicitly lays out his own view regarding scientific realism:

As I see it . . . a consistent scientific realist must hold that the world of everyday experience is a phenomenal world in the Kantian sense, existing only as the contents of actual and obtainable conceptual representings, the obtainability of which is explained not, as for Kant, by things in themselves known only to God, but scientific objects about which, barring catastrophe, we shall know more and more as the years go by. (p. 56)

So for Sellars, when we describe the world in the way in which it is manifest to us, as containing tables and chairs, lizards and persons, we are merely representing the world as it appears to us, and that we can describe the world in terms of such appearances is explained by the way in which the world really is, which is the way in which the world will be described in ideal science. This is the view of the world that Sellars famously expressed in the claim that "In the dimension of describing and explaining the world, science is the measure of all things, of what is that it is, and of what is not that it is not." In light of this second quote it is clear that Sellars' form of scientism extends the authority of science to existence claims: that which is, is that over which final science quantifies. And, if any individual, described in any way, exists, then that individual must be identical with individuals over which final science quantifies, because those individuals that exist are all and only those individuals over which final science quantifies.[1]

As already mentioned, Brandom thinks that this is, simply, a bad idea. But the argument he uses to show that it is a bad idea is anything but simple. Indeed, the argument is subtle and complex and directly depends on a central Sellarsian claim that Brandom accepts and adopts. Although there is not enough space in this review to do it justice, it is possible to present this argument in outline.

As Brandom points out, claims that 'A' and 'B' co-refer, or that A is identical to B, would seem to imply that A and B have the same properties and that 'A' and 'B' can be substituted for one another in sentences without changing the truth value of those sentences. But in intentional and modal contexts, substitutivity salva veritate fails. These facts have led most contemporary philosophers to accept the doctrine that Brandom labels 'extensionalism'. Extensionalism, as Brandom sees it, has two parts. First, it holds that "identicals are indiscernible only with respect to extensional predicates/properties." (p. 64). Second,

The defining feature of extensional predicates/properties is that what they apply to in a given possible world, for instance, the actual world, depends only on what is true at that world. . . . They are in this sense modally insulated, in that their conditions of applicability (what they describe) are insulated from facts about what would happen if . . . . (p. 64-65)

But, Brandom argues, following Sellars following Kant, there are no modally isolated predicates and there are no modally isolated properties. This is the 'modal Kant-Sellars thesis'. So, to mention just a few of the many examples that Brandom uses, to say that the lion is sleeping lightly implies that some moderate stimulus would wake the lion, to say that some patch of paint is red implies that the patch would look brown to a standard observer under green light, and would look red to a standard observer under standard conditions, and to say that some sample is copper implies that it would melt if it were heated to 1084 degrees Celsius. And these implications regarding what would happen under counterfactual conditions are necessary aspects of what it means to say that the lion is sleeping lightly, or that the patch is red, or that the sample is copper. But if there are no modally isolated properties, then substitutivity salva veritate can't be restricted to modally isolated predicates, for there are none, extensionalism must be false, and genuinely identical individuals must share all their properties in common, including their modal properties. And this implies that if A and B have different identity conditions, that is, different properties regarding the counterfactual conditions under which they would exist, then they are not identical. But, given that manifest image individuals such as lizards have different identity conditions than any mereological sum of scientific micro-individuals, lizards, and every other individual countenanced by the manifest image, can't be identical with any scientific individual. ("Nothing is identical to the mereological sum of things of other kinds." (p. 78)) And from this (together with a second argument concerning functional specifications) it follows that

It just is not the case that everything we talk about in the manifest image that exists at all . . . is something specifiable in the language of an eventual natural science. The manifest image is not best thought of as an appearance, of which the world as described by science is the reality. (p. 87)

Lizards, whatever they are, are not appearances of complexes of scientifically countenanced micro-particles.[2]

So Brandom rejects Sellars' appropriation of the phenomena/noumena distinction in the name of his acceptance of another part of Sellars' appropriation of Kant, the Kant-Sellars modal thesis. This thesis also plays a central role in Brandom's development and positive evaluation of Sellars' appropriation of Kant's views regarding categories. This development is oriented by three fundamental insights. The first and most basic of these insights is that Sellars was profoundly Kantian, and, in particular, that much of his work can be profitably read as Sellars' attempt to play the same role in relation to the logical empiricism of the twentieth century that Kant played in relation to Hume's empiricism. Hume had recognized that if one takes empiricism seriously, then an entire class of seemingly indispensible ideas, the ideas that involve necessity in one way or another, become incomprehensible. To take the classic example, if all ideas arise in impressions, then the ordinary idea of a cause becomes unintelligible, insofar as that idea implies that if A causes B there is some non-logical sense in which that A occurs necessitates that B occur.

In the face of this challenge Kant had in effect responded that, empiricist strictures to the contrary, the applicability of ordinary empirical concepts requires that concepts that involve necessity, such as the concept of a cause, are also applicable, because the conditions on application of the ordinary empirical concepts include specifications of what would happen under counterfactual conditions. This is the Kantian version of the Kant-Sellars modal thesis. So, for example, it is an implication of the Kantian form of this thesis that one can't experience or attribute an individual event without experiencing or attributing any of its causal relations with other events, as Hume's analysis requires. For, for it to be the case that an event (that is, for Kant a change in a property of an object) has been experienced (as opposed to a change in the apprehension by the subject of some property of an object) implies that that alteration falls under some causal law according to which, in some range of possible antecedent circumstances, that alteration is necessary given some causal antecedent, i.e., that that alteration would have occurred under some range of counterfactual conditions as long as its causal antecedent was present. The experience of an object having some property is not independent of the possibility of apprehending a change in property, and the possibility of apprehending a change in property is not independent of understanding the possibility of that change being caused. To experience a patch of paint as red is to understand that it would look brown under green light, unless, of course, the color of the patch is caused to change by, for example, adding a little yellow pigment. So, Brandom's Sellars realizes that for Kant the concept of cause is different in kind from ordinary empirical concepts. The concept of a cause is a category, that is, a concept that is implicit in the use of all concepts that are used to describe things in the world, but, because it is a concept that is implicit in the application of any empirical concept, it can be grasped independently of the grasp of any particular empirical concept.

Having recognized that Kant responded to Hume in this way, Brandom's Sellars aspired to make the same type of move in response to twentieth century logical empiricism. But (and this is Brandom's second fundamental insight into the aspect of the Sellarsian appropriation of Kant that he endorses) for Sellars this Kantian move was carried out in a linguistic key. Sellars was committed to a form of the 'linguistic turn' according to which "philosophy is properly conceived as the pure theory of empirically meaningful languages." (p. 4) But, then, in the context provided by this linguistic turn, for Sellars, Kantian claims regarding what is necessary for the possibility of experience become transposed into claims regarding what is necessary for the possibility of ordinary descriptive language. So, in this new way of words, the analogue to saying that it is a necessary condition on being able to experience an event as an event that an agent be able to apply the concept of causal relation is something like the claim that vocabulary that has modal content, for example, saying that A causes B, expresses "essential features of the framework within which alone genuine description is possible." (p. 43) That is, modal talk is metalinguistic in the sense that it expresses something about what is necessary for descriptive talk.

We can begin to see how this is supposed to work if we return to the modal Kant-Sellars thesis. According to that thesis, any descriptive assertion implies a set of counterfactual consequences, and those consequences are essential to the meaning of what is said in the assertion. It follows from this that anyone who can successfully make such a descriptive assertion must 'implicitly' recognize, and accept, those counterfactual implications. (It is for this reason that, for Brandom and Sellars, parrots don't count as making assertions. Because when they consistently make a sound in the presence of some object they fail to implicitly accept these counterfactual implications; the best they can do is label things.) For example, anyone who counts as asserting that the lion is sleeping lightly must also approve at least some of the inferences that follow from the lion sleeping lightly, such as that a moderate stimulus would wake the lion. And, according to Brandom's Sellars, one way in which such a linguistic agent can approve or endorse such an inference is by using modal language, as when one explicitly asserts the corresponding subjunctive conditional. For, according to Brandom's Sellars, "what one is doing in using modal expressions is explaining, justifying, or endorsing an inference." (p. 136)

At this point, however, one needs to be careful. For, as Brandom points out in Chapter 3 (which originally appeared elsewhere), it is easy to misunderstand the claim that modal talk is metalinguistic. In particular, according to Brandom it would be a mistake to understand the claim that what one is doing in using modal talk is endorsing an inference as implying either that (1) there could be no language that lacks modal and subjunctive vocabulary but in which it is possible to assert descriptions, or that (2) what one is saying when one uses modal language is that some inference is a good one. As Brandom recognizes, if the claim that what one is doing in using modal expressions is endorsing an inference has either of these implications, then the claim is false, for the simple reason that both (1) and (2) are false.

So Brandom owes us an interpretation of Sellars' metalinguistic view of modal language that shows why it is that the position does not have these implications, and in Chapter 3 he begins to supply such a an interpretation. The falsity of (1) is fairly easy to understand, and doesn't present any serious difficulty for the Sellarsian metalinguistic view of modal discourse. There are ways to implicitly approve an inference, for example, by reasoning according to that inference, without explicitly endorsing it. So it doesn't follow from the truth of the two premises that the use of descriptive language always involves approval of inferences involving counterfactuals and that what one is doing with modal language is endorsing such inferences, that there can be no language in which it is possible to describe things that does not include modal or subjunctive vocabulary. But the failure of the second implication is more problematic for Sellars. It just isn't true that modal talk is saying anything about inferences; when one says that heating copper to 1084 Celsius causes the copper to melt, one is talking about the copper, not about the inference from 'This sample is copper' and 'This sample is heated to 1084 Celsius' to 'This sample melts'. So in what sense is the causal language metalinguistic; in what sense is the causal claim endorsing the inference, if it is not saying that the inference is a good one?

Given the importance for Sellars' project of this question, he has remarkably little to offer by way of an answer. The only relevant suggestion that Brandom can find is the distinction between saying and 'conveying', as when in asserting 'The sky is clear today' I say that the sky is clear, while I convey that I believe the sky is clear. It is a remarkable feature of this book, and of Brandom's work in general, that he is able to construct a well worked out answer to the question of the relation between saying and doing on such a slender Sellarsian foundation. Indeed, this foundation is so slender that at this point one suspects that much of the discussion here owes far more to Brandom than it does to Sellars, or to Kant. The clue that Brandom uses in interpreting, and going beyond, Sellars on this issue is Brandom's third fundamental insight, the insight that (mostly despite himself) Sellars' thought is informed by a specific kind of pragmatism.

By 'pragmatism' in this connection I mean that the project of offering a metalinguistic reading of framework-explicating nondescriptive concepts such as modal, normative, and ontological ones is conducted in terms of pragmatic metavocabularies: vocabularies for talking about the use of expressions, about discursive social practices. (p. 5)

When Brandom approaches Sellars' distinction between saying and conveying from this pragmatic angle, what gets highlighted is that what I am doing in asserting 'The sky is clear' is making an assertion regarding the way the world is, even though what I am saying is 'The sky is clear'. From the content of this assertion one can properly (but not formally validly) infer that it is not raining; from the fact that I am asserting this content one can properly (but not validly) infer that I believe that the sky is clear, and this is what is 'conveyed' by my asserting. Analogously, what I am doing when I say 'Being heated to 1084 Celsius causes copper to melt' is, according to Brandom, endorsing the inference from 'X is copper' and 'X is heated to 1084 Celsius' to 'X melts', even though I am not describing this inference as a good one. And to say that what I am doing is endorsing this inference is to say that

explicitly modal 'lawlike' statements are statements that one is committed or entitled to whenever one is committed or entitled to endorse such patterns of counterfactually robust inference, and commitment or entitlement to which in their turn commit or entitle one to the corresponding pattern of inference. (p.142)

That is, the pattern of inference is appropriate to engage in just in case the corresponding modal statement is appropriate to use. But this, for Brandom, doesn't imply that what the modal statement is saying is that the pattern of inference is a good one. It is not describing the inference as a good one "for the simple reason that the use of modal expressions is not in the first instance descriptive." (p.142)

If modal expressions aren't in the first instance descriptive, then what, if anything, do they say, what is their content? In Chapters 4 and 5, Brandom attempts to deal with this question, and here it is pretty clear that he goes beyond Sellars. For Brandom, what such sentences say, their content, is that there are corresponding modal facts, for Brandom is a modal realist even though he is also a modal expressivist, and "Modal realism says that modal vocabulary does describe the world, does say how things are."[3] (p 205) The trick, of course, is in showing how these two views are compatible, that is, in showing how even though "the use of modal expressions is not in the first instance descriptive" it can nevertheless be the case that "modal vocabulary does describe the world, does say how things are."

In outline, here is how Brandom tries to pull off the trick. He starts by reiterating, for modal vocabulary, the distinction between saying and doing. What one is doing when one makes a modal assertion is "endorsing an inference relating descriptive concepts as subjunctively (including counterfactually) robust." (p. 205) According to the modal Kant-Sellars thesis, that an agent is able to so endorse such inferences in some fashion is a necessary condition on that agent's using descriptive language at all. What the modal language does is specify, make explicit, that ability. On the other hand, what one is saying or claiming is that possession of one descriptive property is a consequence of, or incompatible with, possession of another such property. So far, so good. But by itself the immediate import of this distinction is a bit deflationary. If this is all that expressivism about modal language amounts to, what is all the fuss about? Of course, one might say, when one asserts a modal claim about the way the world is, one is doing something that involves the endorsement of subjunctively robust inferences; after all, those inferences are good ones because the corresponding modal claims are true. The truth of modal realism explains why it is that it is appropriate for speakers to endorse subjunctively robust inferences by, among other means, asserting modal claims. But Brandom does not accept this deflationary understanding. Rather, he attempts to reverse the order of explanation, and use modal expressivism to explain an essential aspect of modal realism. "Modal realism makes essential use of the concepts of fact and law, but does not by itself explain those concepts. Modal Expressivism does." (p. 208)

The key move here is based on a distinction that Brandom has used in other contexts, the distinction between 'sense dependence' and 'reference dependence'. Brandom holds that the concepts of law and fact are sense dependent on the concepts asserting and inferring, but that facts and laws are not reference dependent on assertings and inferrings. That is, "One cannot understand the concepts fact and law except in a context that includes the concepts asserting and inferring." (p. 208) But there can be facts and laws even though there are not, and never have been or will be, any actual inferrings or assertings. In this respect, Brandom is claiming that modal properties are similar to response-dependent properties. What it is to be pleasant is to be such that a thing would give standard humans pleasure were it encountered by humans. So the concept of pleasant can only be understood through its relation with the concept of human pleasure, the first concept is sense dependent on the second. But for all that, given these definitions there is no reason that something can't be pleasant even if there were no humans to feel pleasure in its presence. Brandom's claim is that in a similar way modal expressivism shows that one can only understand modal concepts if one understands concepts involved in the pragmatics of language, such as asserting and inferring, but that nevertheless there would be facts and laws even if, counterfactually, there are no present, past, or future assertings or inferrings. And, since if modal expressivism is correct that fact and law are sense dependent on asserting and inferring, there a way in which modal expressivism explains fact and law.

The evident weakness in this argument is that to reach the conclusion that Brandom wants he must rely on the premises that "facts are essentially, and not just accidentally, something that can be asserted" and "laws are essentially, and not just accidentally, something that support subjunctively and counterfactually robust inferences." (p. 208) And to show that one must show that the only, or at least the best, way to understand concepts such as law and fact is in terms of the modal expressivism that Brandom has developed through his interpretation of Sellars. But, although Brandom's achievement is impressive, the best that can be said for it is that he has shown how one might understand modal vocabulary, and the vocabulary in which modal realism is couched, in an expressivist way. But he has not shown that this is the only way in which this vocabulary can be understood, or that it is the best way.

Having said this, From Empiricism to Expressivism remains a wonderful book that can be profitably read by anyone who is interested in Brandom, or in Sellars, or in Kant, or, indeed, by any who are at all interested in philosophy of language or metaphysics.

[1] This isn't quite right. As Brandom points out, another possibility is that when the manifest image describes the world as containing individuals that are not identical with the entities that are countenanced by final science, it is possible that the descriptions of manifest entities refer to entities whose identity and individuation conditions are specified in functional terms, and that scientific entities are the realizers of those functions. In this volume Brandom argues against this possibility as well, but as that argument is an extension of the basic argument, I will skip over it here in the interests of concision.

[2] It is worth noting here that this argument targets a view of final science accepted by Sellars, and more common in his time than ours, according to which final science is fundamental physics, and that all the objects of the special sciences are in one sense or another reducible to sums of the objects of physics.

[3] For Brandom, the worldly objective modal facts that modal vocabulary describes are facts concerning the material incompatibility and material consequence relations among properties of objects. The way in which Brandom develops his articulation of this position, and his argument that there are such objective modal facts, is both historically and conceptually fascinating in the manner in which they make essential reference to Aristotle and Hegel. Unfortunately, once again, space constraints do not allow critical discussion and evaluation of this argument.