From Enlightenment to Receptivity: Rethinking our Values

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Michael Slote, From Enlightenment to Receptivity: Rethinking our Values, Oxford University Press, 2013, 272pp., $49.95 (hbk), ISBN 9780199970704.

Reviewed by Erica Lucast Stonestreet, St. John's University/College of Saint Benedict


Michael Slote's basic argument is that the Enlightenment's heavy emphasis on reason and rationality has led us to overlook or willfully ignore the very central role certain emotions play in our values, and that a remedy for this is to better understand and promote a value or virtue he calls "receptivity." The first part of his book serves as a critique of Enlightenment thinking that promises to be more unified and systematic than previous piecemeal criticisms have been. The second part introduces and elaborates the concept of receptivity, which Slote argues hasn't been adequately recognized, although it is the background of much of his and of others' work. He promotes receptivity as an antidote to the excesses and errors of Enlightenment rationality. The hope is that becoming more open to (the ideas and plights of) others and to the possibilities in our own lives will lead to richer and happier lives, which are better suited to deal with the increasingly recognized complexities of modern life. But Slote does not wish to discard Enlightenment values altogether, and his argumentation remains analytic in nature. He emphasizes that in order for his project to succeed, he must provide arguments that rationalists can recognize as real arguments.

The Enlightenment picture against which Slote sets his argument is roughly this. Reason is the highest and most important characteristic of human beings, and as such it is central to the good life. Emotions, being involuntary, are liable to disrupt the functioning of reason and to the extent they do are to be stifled, set aside, or ignored. The path to a good life involves deliberate, cognitive control. Autonomy is the highest ideal for humans, who are seen as separate individuals. Given this characterization, it will not be surprising that Kant and Kantians are Slote's frequent target.

The central message of the book is that the Enlightenment ideal of detachment is not only impossible but also undesirable. The first two chapters treat questions of epistemic virtue. Slote argues that the epistemic virtues of objectivity and open-mindedness are not the purely rational, cognitive matters Enlightenment thinking has led us to believe they are. He contends that being objective requires a certain kind of empathy. When treating the views of those we disagree with charitably, we must view them in something like the favorable light that they do -- that is, we must feel toward these ideas something close to what they feel. This can be hard to do when we're strongly committed to our own positions. But the point is that this feeling is an exercise in empathic understanding. Epistemic virtue requires not (or not only) the cool detachment of reason, but also the warmer attachment of empathy. Enlightenment thinking has overlooked an important piece of the picture.

Slote points out that the way we acquire our own beliefs is not purely rational either. We learn a great deal from our parents and other loved ones, and love makes us partial to those we love in ways that make us overlook their faults (including epistemic ones). Here we have two choices, according to Slote: argue that these tendencies are not actually irrational, and thus that "empathically imbibing" the beliefs of those we love is not epistemically irrational, or reject both of these claims together. Either way, Slote claims, "empathy and feeling/emotion turn out to be of greater epistemological significance than has previously been realized" (79). If we accept that belief acquisition through empathy and love is irrational, then we can keep the Enlightenment view of rationality's importance, but do so at the expense of accepting that some of the most important aspects of human life are irrational. Or we could give love a less prominent place in human life. The latter alternative isn't really open to us, Slote claims. Thus, so much the worse for Enlightenment rationality because love is extremely important to a good life.

Thus far, Slote has argued that epistemic rationality is less central to human life than Enlightenment values have long held; he goes on to extend this argument to practical rationality. The argument begins with a criticism of Kantian thought touched off by Bernard Williams' famous "one thought too many" example. Slote argues that the problem with Kantian morality is that it interposes a moral principle between the man and his wife. Care ethics, by contrast, holds that it is morally better to act directly from personal connection rather than through the mediation of principles. Slote claims, plausibly, that this sort of thinking is much closer to our ordinary ways of thinking about morality than the Kantian line is, because we find it morally problematic to be emotionally indifferent to others. Thus, reason is again less central to our thinking than it has been made out to be.

Slote elaborates by arguing that care ethics can best Kantian ethics even on the grounds of its own purported strength: the ability to account for the view that it is morally worse to cause pain than to allow it. According to care ethics, the reason we cannot cause harm even at the expense of allowing others to suffer is that the person we would be harming is more empathically proximate to us. Thus, although the sentimentalist care ethicist would agree with the judgment that we can't harvest an innocent person's organs to save several other people, she might well criticize the Kantian for lacking empathy in arriving at that judgment.

 While the examples Slote brings to bear on these issues are persuasive, I have some lingering doubts that the case against the Kantian has been fully made here. Consider the classic organ-harvesting example. I take it that the problem with the Kantian line -- a version of which holds that nabbing an innocent bystander to harvest her organs does not respect her humanity -- does not account for the fact that we are also to respect the humanity of those her organs would save. If we are to respect all agents, regardless of whether we have relationships with them, then we might see an impasse here. But if this is the right story, I don't see why care ethics is any better on this front. The doctor probably has the would-be recipients in hospital beds, also in empathic proximity to herself. So why is her empathy supposed to be stronger for the innocent donor than for the equally innocent recipients? Presumably the difference between causing and allowing harm is in play (as it is in the Kantian version): it's not her fault that the recipients would die without the organs; it would be her fault if the donor died, and this is supposed to excite more empathy. But why isn't this a one-sided, and to that extent faulty, empathy (as Slote discusses on 110-111)? If the remedy is to feel more empathy, as Slote (quite plausibly) claims, then we'd be extending empathy to the recipients, which would tend in favor of the operation. He seems to be assuming that something about the immediacy of causing the harm is important to empathy, but he never makes this fully clear, and thus it's not clear why care ethics does better regarding this case.

One argument I found particularly compelling was Slote's contention that morality's importance is limited by some considerations of self-interest. His version of care ethics holds that an action is morally wrong if it exhibits a lack of full empathic concern for others. This would be an unreasonable demand if full empathy required total selflessness. But Slote points out that just as we can be convinced of something without being perfectly certain of it, we can be fully empathic without being perfectly empathic. The implication of this is that we can make sense of two conflicting intuitions about supererogation: first, that there is such a thing, so that there are acts that are morally praiseworthy that aren't required of everyone; and second, that saintly folks who do supererogatory things aren't necessarily being totally rational when they do them. We see such people as exhibiting an extraordinary amount of empathy for others, but nevertheless hold on to the idea that this is extraordinary and not required of everyone because it does require a real sacrifice of self-interest. Slote thinks that this, too, is a strength of his sentimentalism against Kantian ethics, because such acts "[make] a sacrifice of" rational interests, something that a Kantian couldn't condone. Kantians can't have the both/and regarding supererogation that sentimentalism can, and thus their view doesn't fit as well with widespread intuitions about such actions. We have, therefore, another reason to limit the importance of rationality in our thinking: it can be praiseworthy to act in ways that Enlightenment thinking would criticize as irrational.

At the end of Part I, Slote identifies a greater appreciation for the role of emotions in our lives generally and in ethics in particular as the major positive implication of his arguments. Arguments for a positive view of emotions are not new, he acknowledges, but his critique of Enlightenment values provides new arguments and ones he thinks are more systematic and thus more likely to stick. This is in part, he suggests, because in addition to a critique, he offers an alternative to Enlightenment ways of thinking about ethics: his sentimentalist care ethics with empathy at its heart. Empathy offers us a way to deal with the increasingly recognized complexities of our interconnected and diverse world that Enlightenment rationality has been unable to handle (witness the atrocities of the twentieth century). Thus, he is optimistic that the empathy-based alternative he offers has a chance to move us beyond Enlightenment thinking.

The second half of the book describes the notion of receptivity and recasts many of Slote's previous arguments in its terms. One thing that seems lacking here is a compact characterization of receptivity. The name itself says much, but I would have appreciated something like a direct definition. Receptivity is a positive disposition toward others that is closely related to empathy, which requires us to be receptive to the feelings and views of others in the sense of coming to feel, to some extent, what they feel; but Slote thinks receptivity is a wider notion. It is not an emotion, because being receptive to what life brings you does not necessarily involve emotions as such. Slote notes that we are in new ethical and intellectual territory in taking this notion seriously.

Receptivity contrasts with both activity and passivity, Being receptive to others, to what our own lives bring us, and to the value of non-sentient things like the environment requires resisting our desire for full control over our lives (what Slote terms our "Faustian" tendencies), and thus it requires not exaggerating the value of action. Receptivity and activity curb one another, and Slote argues that activity is valuable only to the extent that it helps us realize receptivity. But neither can we become totally passive. Receptivity includes a readiness to respond to the world that does require activity. This is, I take it, the major reason why receptivity is a virtue.

There is also a reciprocal limiting relationship between receptivity and autonomy. Slote construes autonomy in a simple, perhaps commonsense, way: willingness and ability to think and decide for oneself. This is a valuable trait, and one that we can blame structures of oppression for curtailing. But it requires that we not be fully receptive to those around us, and emphasizes our separateness. Reciprocally, however, being receptive (and thus connected) to those around us will render us less than fully autonomous. I'm not sure this needs to be the case, actually, since thinking with others can enhance the autonomy of each, but discussing this would take us too far afield.

There is an implicit tension between saying that it's not only acceptable but a positive good for people to absorb the views of those around them, and recognizing that sometimes those views are damaging. Slote responds to this challenge by noting that damaging ideas can be independently criticized for their lack of empathy and/or receptivity, and this is not something we should blame the victims for; we can still maintain that their receptivity is a virtue. I'm a bit uneasy here. We want to say that we shouldn't be receptive to, and should even be somewhat intolerant toward, intolerant views of others. (I have in mind the example of the debate over marriage equality.) The line between views we should be receptive to and those we shouldn't is supposed to be drawn by a criticizable lack of empathy/receptivity. But how do we know who merits empathy in a debate? Supporters of marriage equality criticize opponents with accusations that amount to claims that they lack empathy. This seems right. But opponents paint themselves as victims, and claim that supporters haven't sufficiently listened to their side of the story. It seems to me that supporters of marriage equality are not in fact as receptive as they could be toward the other side. Nevertheless, opponents seem more criticizable than supporters in this respect. It would be helpful to have more detail on how to account for this within the offered framework.

I will not rehearse the connections Slote makes here between receptivity and his critique of Enlightenment and Faustian thinking; he himself does a good job of this and shows how the notion of receptivity and these critiques mutually reinforce one another.

Those who, like me, have doubts about dominant contemporary ethical theories (particularly Kantian ones), and/or sympathies for care ethics and sentimentalism more widely, will find themselves quite receptive to the message and arguments of this book. The idea of receptivity is, I think, a welcome addition to the conversation, and it furthers and unifies worries that have been voiced piecemeal over the last few decades. I am less confident that the book will convert rationalists, because it is most successful where it paints its picture in broad strokes and there are many details yet to be filled in. But I hope that its arguments do help to prompt people to fill in those details and push the landscape of contemporary moral philosophy further toward greater recognition of the role that empathy and receptivity play in our daily lives and our philosophical thinking.