From Frege to Wittgenstein: Perspectives on Early Analytic Philosophy

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Reck, Erich H. (ed.), From Frege to Wittgenstein: Perspectives on Early Analytic Philosophy, Oxford University Press, 2002, 488pp, $65.00 (hbk), ISBN 0-19-513326-9.

Reviewed by Marie McGinn, University of York


In his sympathetic and engaging introductory essay to this impressive collection, Erich Reck quotes a remark that Wittgenstein made to Geach a few days before he died: ‘I wish I could have written like Frege’. The depth of Wittgenstein’s intellectual esteem for Frege is also clearly expressed in the famous acknowledgement in the Preface to the Tractatus: ‘I am indebted to Frege’s great works and to the writings of my friend Bertrand Russell for much of the stimulation of my thoughts.’ The sense of admiration and obligation expressed in these remarks is profound, yet the nature of Wittgenstein’s debt to Frege is notoriously difficult to pin down. Wittgenstein’s direct references to Frege are almost uniformly critical. Where a more positive influence can be identified – notably, Frege’s anti-psychologism, his banishing of epistemological considerations from logic, his formulation of the context principle and his implicit development of a distinction between saying and showing – the ideas tend to be rethought and fundamentally transformed in the context of Wittgenstein’s philosophy. There is, moreover, little in the detail either of Wittgenstein’s philosophical aims or his method that would obviously identify him as someone who has derived his conception of philosophy from the works of Frege. Yet, for all that, the sense of an affinity is real, particularly in Wittgenstein’s early philosophy. It is not only that the problems that Wittgenstein is concerned with are ones that Frege had helped to articulate or make precise, but also that there is something in the intensity and rigor of Wittgenstein’s thought that echoes the uncompromising seriousness and integrity of Frege’s writings. Reck’s biographical essay suggests that the elusiveness of the relation is due, at least in part, to the fact that Frege’s influence is exerted as much through his philosophical personality and style of enquiry as through his ideas. The sense that there is something important to be gained by studying the relation between the two philosophers transcends the question of identifiable, direct influence insofar as each of them is committed to ‘go[ing] the bloody hard way’ on what they both perceive to be the fundamental questions concerning logic and language.

Apart from the question of influence, it is also the case that the work of both philosophers is currently the focus of a major interpretative dispute. Furthermore, the lines of interpretative fracture that characterize the two disputes are more or less parallel: is the work of Frege/early Wittgenstein properly read as putting forward a substantive philosophy of language – i.e., some sort of philosophical account of how language functions, or of how language hooks up with the world – or not? As well as exploring the relation between Frege and Wittgenstein, the papers that make up this volume can be seen as a contribution to this interpretative debate. Although there is no sense of an agreed agenda, or of consensus on questions of interpretation – a number of the papers are explicitly or implicitly in dispute with one another – the authors are generally united in adopting an anti-theoretical stance. Indeed, the book could be regarded as a showcase for work that takes as its starting point the rejection of the tradition that would find a substantial philosophy of language in Frege and early Wittgenstein, and which embarks on the task of reexamination and reappraisal that this rejection of a long standing approach implies. It is impossible to do justice in a short review to the wealth of philosophical and scholarly insight that these papers provide, but it is clear that they represent a major contribution to the literature on early analytic philosophy and that a number of them will become an important focuses for future debate.

The opposition of Frege and early Wittgenstein to most of contemporary analytic philosophy of language that is implied by the anti-theoretical reading of their work is explicitly explored in the paper by Hans Sluga, ‘Frege and the Indefinability of Truth’. Sluga argues that Frege’s idea, that “the content of the word ‘true’ is altogether unique and indefinable”, captures an important philosophical insight; one that is overlooked by those who have been reared on Tarski-style, semantic definitions, and who have succumbed to the mistaken idea that such definitions provide the kind of philosophical explication of the concept of truth that Frege claims to be impossible. He argues that it is a mistake to suppose that Frege’s point about truth amounts to what has come to be known as the redundancy view. Frege’s insight is altogether deeper and touches on the impossibility of attempting to explicate the relation between language and the world. What Frege sees, Sluga suggests, is that the indefinability of the truth predicate is grounded in the fact that a grasp of the concept of truth is essentially already implicit in our ability to use language to make appropriate assertions, and as such it cannot be made a topic of explicit definition or theoretical explication. The relation between language and the world, which a definition of truth aims to describe, is something that is essentially already presupposed and made manifest in our ability to use language to make assertions that are ‘responsible to the world’. Thus, the content of the word ‘true’ is already given immediately when a language in which we express judgments is given; we cannot introduce it by means of a definition. We should, therefore, see all talk about truth as in its nature merely didactic and transitional, for insofar as our grasp of the concept is essentially already manifest in our practice of expressing judgments, the truth predicate itself has no essential role to play within a fully worked out logical language. Other objections that Frege might have to Tarski-style truth definitions aside, Sluga argues that an appreciation of the above point motivates an anti-metaphysical, minimalist interpretation of what such definitions achieve: meeting Tarski’s criterion of adequacy means that we can call an object-language sentence true when we are in a position to assert its meta-linguistic translation.

Sluga believes that Frege’s fundamental insight about the impossibility of explicating the relation between language and the world is one that he shares with Wittgenstein. However, he also argues that Frege’s remarks on truth in ‘The Thought’ are in part directed against what he took to be the correspondence conception of truth expressed in the Tractatus. The apparent conflict is resolved by the fact that the account of truth that is expressed in the early part of the Tractatus is ultimately swept away in remarks, neglected by Frege, in which ‘Wittgenstein proceeds … to deconstruct all semantic theorizing and concludes that all attempts to speak about logic are bound to fail’ (p.92). In a wonderfully rich and subtle paper, which is in part a response to an earlier paper of Sluga’s, Cora Diamond takes up in more detail this question of whether the Tractatus puts forward a correspondence conception of truth. The idea that Wittgenstein is putting forward such a view – even ineffably – would clearly go against Diamond’s resolute reading of the Tractatus, and she argues very forcefully that all talk in the Tractatus of sentences as having a relation to reality is gradually shown by Wittgenstein to dissolve from within. It is not that there is such a relation – the relation Sluga characterizes as ‘responsibility to the world’ – that cannot be described, but makes itself manifest in our practice of assertion. Rather, on analogy with Ricketts’ and Goldfarb’s treatments of Wittgenstein’s talk of possibility, we are brought to recognize that our understanding of talk of a relation to reality is nothing over and above our grasp of how we can pass, e.g., from the statement that p, or the statement that A believes p and p, to the statement that ‘p’ is true, or the statement that A’s belief is correct, respectively. Thus, the idea of a relation to reality is seen to resolve itself into a grasp of the internal connection between propositions that is manifest in our ways of operating with the sentences of our language: ‘Our talk is responsible to the world in that propositions can figure in such patterns of operation in two different kinds of place: giving a content and saying what is so’ (p.272). Insofar as Sluga’s suggestion still hints at the idea of a relation between language and something outside it, which cannot be put into words, or which lies beyond the limit of language, it has not completely thrown off the spectre of the metaphysical reading of Wittgenstein’s text.

Diamond’s reading of the Tractatus here is undoubtedly compelling. Yet in arguing that ‘our ideas about correspondence are attempts to articulate features of our use of senseful sentences’ that direct us to ‘the logic of our ways of speaking about content’ (p. 271), Diamond herself seems implicitly to draw a distinction between saying and showing that the resolute reading has generally been taken to deny. The ‘features of our use of senseful sentences’ that our idea of correspondence is an attempt to articulate – i.e. to say – would appear to be features that are made manifest only in our practice of using language, or in the internal connection between propositions that this practice reveals. It is hard not to read this as a form of recognition that it is by coming to see what our ordinary use of language shows or makes clear – ‘the logic of our operating with senseful sentences’ (p.271) – that we are released from our confused desire to develop a theoretical conception of what the relation of correspondence consists in. Our talk of the idea of correspondence is seen to be empty, but it is also seen to be prompted by an aspect of our mastery which shows (and exhausts) what our idea amounts to. Diamond certainly gets rid of the problematic idea of a relation that exists between language and the world but which it is beyond the limits of language to express. However, she appears to replace this problematic idea with a distinction internal to language between what is shown in the use of expressions – their ‘logic’ – and what is said by means of them. This is not a distinction between two kinds of thought (effable and ineffable), but a recognition that the expression of thought takes place within a system, and that the system is manifest in the use of propositions and in the transitions that we make between them. Thus, the system is something that is made manifest over time, and not in the expression of any particular thought: something that is shown and cannot be said. If this is right, then what we have here looks to be a re-interpretation of Wittgenstein’s saying/showing distinction, rather than an abandonment of it. And it would suggest, contrary to the prevailing idea of the resolute reading’s account of the structure of the work, that the standard interpretation of the saying/showing distinction is not one that Wittgenstein ever articulates in the Tractatus, not even as a step on a ladder that is later to be cast away, but is, from beginning to end, a misreading.

Jim Conant’s paper, ‘The Method of the Tractatus’, already enjoys an established reputation as a locus classicus of the resolute reading, and it is excellent to see it published here in full for the first time. Conant’s argument is directed primarily against the sort of reading that I have just suggested might be found in Sluga’s treatment of Wittgenstein on correspondence: the idea that there are features of reality, or of language’s relation to reality, that cannot be expressed because the logical structure of language makes their expression impossible. These features or relations lie beyond the limit of language, but they can be gestured at through ‘elucidations’. The sentences that are used in the elucidation of these features and relations have the status of what Conant calls ‘substantial nonsense’: they are struggling to say something (express a thought) that cannot be said in language but which makes itself manifest. Conant argues, again very carefully and very convincingly, that one of the central aims of the Tractatus is to make the reader recognize that the expressions occurring in a sentence have sense only to the extent that the sentence as a whole has a sense, i.e. is used, in a specific context, to express a determinate judgment. A sentence cannot fail to make sense because it is composed of parts which individually have sense, but which are put together in a way that results in nonsense. Either a sentence is used to express a determinate judgment, or it is not even properly called a sentence; it is a mere empty flourish, a jumble of inscriptions none of which possesses a sense. This leaves no room for the idea of sentences that try but fail to make sense, or of thoughts that lie beyond the limit of language: we are either using language to express thoughts, or we are simply failing to make sense. On Conant’s interpretation of it, elucidation in the Tractatus is not concerned with the problematic idea of revealing what makes itself manifest but cannot be said, but with exposing apparent senseful sentences as nonsense, that is, with exploding the illusion of sense from within. The sign that we have understood the author of the work is that we find ourselves able to throw all sentences that appear to talk about ‘the limits of language’, or ‘unsayable things’, away.

Many people have already expressed perplexity with the central idea of the resolute reading of the Tractatus. Not least among their worries has been the problem of understanding how a text that consists entirely of nonsense could bring about the realization of anything, even its own nonsensicality. Clearly, the idea of ‘exploding from within’ is vital to the resolute reading’s ability to provide a convincing or coherent account of Wittgenstein’s philosophical aims. The idea is that we begin by taking Wittgenstein’s words at face value and only when we try to give them a sense do we see them fall apart and melt away. It is not that we realize that there is something we cannot do, but that there is nothing we were trying but failing to say. Sentences that initially appear to us to express thoughts about, e.g., truth as correspondence, or about a distinction between saying and showing, are gradually revealed to express no thoughts at all, and the temptation to peddle them as philosophical insights evaporates. It is hard to underestimate the impact that this idea – also put forward by Diamond and defended by a number of the contributors to this volume – has had on discussion of the Tractatus, or its effect in inspiring a resurgence of interest in Wittgenstein’s early work. Yet, even if one is completely persuaded by Conant’s and Diamond’s attacks on the standard interpretation of the Tractatus, and on the substantial conception of nonsense on which it depends, it is not clear that one is brought all the way to the idea of total evaporation – the complete and utter emptying of the idea of philosophical insight – that this account of the resolute reading seems to impose on us. For when it comes to engaging with the details of the text, even the would-be resolute reader might be inclined to acknowledge that Wittgenstein’s remarks serve to mark or clarify a whole series of distinctions within language – e.g. between names and propositions, between the so-called propositions of logic and genuine propositions, between the former and propositions of generality, and between what is shown in the use of symbols and what is said by means of them – and a whole series of internal relations – e.g. that between a proposition, p, and a proposition, q, that can be inferred from it, or that between the proposition p and the proposition “ ‘p’ is true” – whose significance we are inclined to overlook. And even that it is precisely by our coming to see these distinctions and internal relations, and their significance, more clearly that we are freed from the attempt, e.g., to justify logical inference by appeals to laws of logic, or to articulate a relation between language and something that lies outside it, or to treat the propositions of logic and arithmetic as expressions of thoughts, and so on. The idea of ‘exploding nonsense from within’ does not clearly provide an accurate description of this process, but yet discerning this process at work in the text does not fall back into committing Wittgenstein to thoughts that lie beyond the limits of language. It might, of course, be thought that such a reading of the text would render the status of Wittgenstein’s remarks themselves problematic, insofar as it seems to hang on to the idea that there is something positive – something we might want to characterize as an ‘insight’ – achieved by them. And this is clearly at odds with what Conant and Diamond take to be essential to the resolute reading: that, at the end of the work, everything in the body of the text is to be cast away as nonsense. However, it seems to me that a slightly less resolute reading of the Tractatus leaves Wittgenstein’s remarks in no worse a state than the remarks of the Philosophical Investigations; it is still possible to hold that Wittgenstein is not putting forward philosophical doctrines or informing us of anything, but is merely engaged in a logical (or grammatical) investigation aimed at clarifying, or uncovering an order in, something we are already completely master of, namely the logic of our language.

Many of the papers in the volume – including Cora Diamond’s – would seem to fit the above characterization of Wittgenstein’s philosophical aims rather better than the fundamentalist interpretation of the resolute reading that Conant’s argument may seem to invite. It would certainly fit the wonderfully detailed and lucid account of Wittgenstein’s remarks on arithmetic, by Juliet Floyd, which makes clear the depth and the nature of Wittgenstein’s opposition to Russell and Frege’s treatment of number. This paper also contains important criticisms of Diamond’s commitment to the idea that the Tractatus is committed to a Begriffsschrift that reflects the logical order of thought. Floyd argues with great flair that, even in the Tractatus, Wittgenstein sets out to upset the philosopher’s desire to chart the bounds of sense, and to expose how little the idea of drawing logical or categorial distinctions can accomplish. His own distinctions are not to be taken as correct, but rather as an attempt to recover or reveal the order of ordinary modes of speaking in the face of the philosopher’s misguided attempt at system: these are distinctions drawn for a purpose, and are never thought of by Wittgenstein as ‘absolutely the correct ones’. There is, therefore, no generic grammatical category of nonsense that places the remarks of the Tractatus itself beyond the linguistic pale; we have rather to consider the dialectical point of these remarks and how Wittgenstein’s use of the concept of nonsense functions within it. We should, Floyd argues, treat them more on a par with the remarks of the Philosophical Investigations than the strict interpretation of 6.54, with which the resolute reading is associated, allows. This is not, she stresses, to reject the spirit of Diamond’s anti-metaphysical reading, but it might be seen as giving it a further development.

There is no time to discuss the other excellent papers in this volume: Goldfarb’s reassessment of Wittgenstein’s debt to Frege (arguing that where Wittgenstein and Frege arrive at similar views, Wittgenstein does so independently); Ricketts on the centrality of the distinction between functions and operators and its connection with the idea of propositions as models; Wiener’s elucidatory interpretation of section 31 of The basic Laws of Arithmetic; Shieh on what the dispute between the semantic and anti-semantic interpretation of Frege amounts to; Ruffino on how Frege understands the notion of a logical object; Proops’ discussion of Wittgenstein on inference and entailment; and a number of essays exploring the relation between Wittgenstein’s early and later work. There is, as I have already remarked, a wealth of philosophical and scholarly insight here; enough to make this volume not merely valuable but essential, not only to anyone who is interested in the history of early analytic philosophy, but to anyone who is interested in the questions concerning logic and language by which analytic philosophy is defined.