From Groups to Individuals: Evolution and Emerging Individuality

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Frédéric Bouchard and Philippe Huneman (eds.), From Groups to Individuals: Evolution and Emerging Individuality, MIT Press, 2013, 278pp., $55.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780262018722.

Reviewed by Johannes Martens, University of Bristol


For centuries, organisms have been considered as the paradigmatic individuals in nature -- and more recently, as the privileged level of analysis in biological sciences. But in the past three decades, a number of theoretical developments in evolutionary biology have led to a radical upheaval of our previous intuitions concerning the notion of individuality, as well as concerning the centrality of organisms in the living world. Drawing on these recent developments, this volume provides us with a comprehensive but also challenging overview of the conceptual changes that have emerged from evolutionary theory and that currently pervade the different branches of philosophy of biology.

At the root of these changes lies one fundamental realization, made explicit by the work of Leo Buss[1] that unifies all the essays: individuality is "a derived character", a contingent product of evolution but not a primary feature of any living entity. This realization was made possible by two early insights of social evolution theory. The first is that individual organisms (like us) are only a part of a broader ecological hierarchy of biological organizations, from unicells to colonial entities (like social insect colonies or symbioses), in which any level shares many functional features with both the lower and the higher levels of the same hierarchy. The second is that each level in this hierarchy of life, including that of individual organisms, is the outcome of social evolution, with groups of genes cooperating to form a genome, groups of cells cooperating to form multicellular organisms, and organisms cooperating to form (occasionally) complex societies, as well as a broad array of mutualistic networks.

Following these earlier breakthroughs, the concept of biological individuality has been progressively decoupled from the classical -- but still problematic -- notion of organism, and generalized to other manifestations of life, either at lower levels (e.g., genes, cells, or unicellular entities) or at higher levels (e.g., colonial forms of life and symbiosis). For instance, it is now widely recognized that organisms are only one possible instance of biological individuality, and that biological individuality, in turn, is only one possible expression of the evolution of sociality. However, this decoupling also generated a whole cluster of conceptual issues related to the biological and philosophical status of these respective notions, which are investigated by the different papers contained in this book.

Two related issues give structure to the whole set of contributions: how new forms of biological individuality have emerged in the natural world from simple groups of lower level entities (e.g., unicells to multicellular organisms), and how these forms succeed in preserving or maintaining their individuality through different timescales, i.e., the lifetime and the evolutionary timescales. But the real originality of these essays is the main thread around which all are organized, namely what this evolutionary shift from groups to individuals implies in what concerns our understanding of both (i) the notion of biological individuality and (ii) our more familiar concept of the organism. In this respect, the book displays a strong philosophical emphasis and stands out from the other recent works (but by no means less excellent) on these topics, like Andrew Bourke's Principles of Social Evolution,[2] or Brett Calcott and Kim Sterelny's The Major Transitions in Evolution Revisited[3] -- the latter focusing primarily on the question of the evolutionary emergence and maintenance of the different forms of biological organizations in the living world, rather than on the issue of biological individuality per se.

The variety of contributions provide the reader with a plurality of contrasting approaches and perspectives on this question, and it is cleverly organized into three parts, which, taken together, form "one long argument about biological individuality" (p. 6). In the first part, the main subtopic concerns the definition of biological individuality and its relation to the concept of organism (e.g., are there any significant differences between these two concepts? are organisms a mere instance of biological individuals, or a distinctive kind of individuals?). In the second part, the contributors try to shed light on the notion of biological individuality from a purely evolutionary point of view, that is, in defining this property in relation to the concept of Darwinian adaptation. Finally, the last part is devoted more specifically to the status of social groups, which seem to function as biological individuals, like some insect colonies, or some symbiotic communities.

Rather than following this order, I would suggest an alternative path through the volume, one centered on an important -- though often neglected -- opposition between two fundamental conceptions of biological individuality. In the current philosophical and biological literature, one finds roughly two (complementary) ways of addressing the problem of what a biological individual is. The first corresponds to what one could call a physiological perspective and consists in focusing on the kind of functional integration that must be displayed by a given biological collective for it to be considered as a true organism. The second, in contrast, consists in determining at which point a given biological collective can be considered as a unit of selection (and thus as a unit susceptible to evolve new adaptations under the action of natural selection), but often independently of its specific functional structure. With this latter perspective, therefore, the criterion of individuality lies in the process of natural selection itself rather than in any particular type of physiological configuration, which makes the approach evolutionary rather than physiological. Moreover, the relevant timescale for defining individuality turns out to be different according to either of two perspectives: for the physiological approaches, the relevant timescale is given by the lifetime of the entity considered, while for the evolutionary approaches, the relevant timescale includes the whole history that led to the emergence of these individuated units. This contrast between the physiological approaches and the evolutionary ones is particularly pronounced across the different contributions, and it led me to a slightly different reading of the whole book than the one originally proposed.

A first set of papers introduces the kind of problems faced by any attempt to provide a theoretical definition of biological individuality.

Ellen Clarke and Samir Okasha (chapter 3) provide a good philosophical preamble to the conceptual issues actually addressed by the other contributions. Drawing on an analogy between the problems raised by the individuation of species and that of organisms, Clarke and Okasha identify two main sources for the difficulties concerning the ascriptions of individuality to particular biological entities. First, they point out, in the same way that we cannot always precisely say whether or not a particular organism belongs to a particular species rather than to another, closely related one, it will not always be possible to determine whether a given entity is a genuine individual  or a mere collection of parts. They call this difficulty the "problem of vagueness", and view it as a direct consequence of the historicity of the organisms that have evolved gradually from simple groups to more integrated entities. Second, in the same way that the identification of a given species will depend of the kind of criterion used by the biologist (e.g., inter-reproduction of the members, a common genealogy, a common ecological niche, etc.), the individuation of a biological entity will generally depend upon the kind of criterion used, which, in turn, will depend on the broader perspective chosen to characterize biological individuality (i.e., either physiological or evolutionary). This is the "multiple-criteria problem", and though the two conceptual difficulties are linked, they should not be conflated.

Peter Godfrey-Smith (chapter 1) introduces the distinction between the concepts of biological individual and organism, and proposes an interesting picture of the relationship between these two notions. A Darwinian individual, according to Godfrey-Smith, is not different from a unit of selection, namely an entity that can evolve adaptations through natural selection and can transmit its characteristics via some form of heritability. An organism, however, is primarily a unit defined according to its functional or metabolic structure whose parts function for the persistence of the whole system. Usually, these two concepts overlap. But there are also a significant number of cases where Darwinian individuals will not be properly envisaged as organisms, and vice versa. For instance, a virus does not have a metabolism but can nevertheless evolve through natural selection, so it will be better envisaged as a "mere" Darwinian individual. In contrast, some symbiotic entities, like the famous squid-Vibrio association, function as autonomous organisms, with a distinctive physiology, but do not possess the distinctive characteristic of a true Darwinian individual (e.g., a heritable fitness).

Matt Haber (chapter 9) tackles a related topic, but focuses primarily on the status of colonial entities -- actually eusocial insect colonies -- as "superorganisms". He distinguishes between two sorts of approaches. The "similarity approaches" describe the functional and morphological features of colonies by analogy with those of multicellular organisms, but fall into the so-called "problem of the paradigm". This problem results from taking multicellular organisms as paradigms of individuality, while they are themselves an expression of colonial life (in their quality of collectives composed of cells). The "selection approaches", however, emphasize the functional integration of these colonies, which make them good candidates for the status of unit of selection. But these too, Haber notes, encounter a difficulty. Indeed, why not merely consider these functionally integrated collectives as biological individuals rather than as an analog of the individual organisms? This is precisely what Haber suggests: he calls for a general concept of biological individuality that could be applied to any kind of collective entity (multicellular or colonial) according to the identification of the relations that generate cohesion among their parts.

A second set of papers comprises those that assimilate biological individuals with units of (Darwinian) adaptation -- the evolutionary approaches -- and try to determinate the conditions under which natural selection can lead to the emergence of new adaptations at higher levels. None of them makes any relevant distinction between the concepts of individual and of organism, which are used synonymously.

Charles Goodnight (chapter 2) provides some important methodological considerations about how the tools from contextual analysis can be used to make the sharpest ascriptions of individuality. Ideally, he claims, when looking for biological individuals, we should always try to identify (using these tools) the level at which the adaptations take place in each particular case. According to him, this level is usually characterized by the lowest level at which entities exhibit a distinctive heritability in their fitness values. But often, unfortunately, this identification will be impeded by a lack of information concerning the precise level at which selection is acting. Hence, some form of methodological pluralism is required here. Due to this scientific limitation, it is important not to conflate the level actually used by the biologist for his ascriptions of individuality with the "true" level at which the adaptations should be ascribed, for this could well be a lower level (e.g., the cell instead of the multicellular whole, or the multicellular organism rather than the colony).

Andy Gardner (chapter 5), is not really concerned with these methodological queries, but adopts a different, formal perspective on the question of the unit of adaptation. Using similar tools from multilevel selection theory, his aim is to give a rigorous characterization of the conditions under which biological collectives (multicellular organisms included) may evolve group adaptations -- and thus may evolve as genuine biological individuals. According to Gardner, two conditions are necessary (though not sufficient) for a group to be considered a unit of adaptation. The first is that there must be selection at the level of this group. The second is that there must be no selection at all within this group -- i.e., the group must be clonal, or there must exist some mechanism of control cancelling the differences of fitness between the individuals within the group. However, though the first condition seems perfectly reasonable, the second one is less intuitive: indeed, even in the most "paradigmatic" of the organisms that we know, we still find some amount of disruptive selection between their parts (e.g., between cells, or between workers of a honeybee colony). Therefore, one might wonder if Gardner's proposed definition should not be envisaged more as an ideal than as an actual definition of what makes a biological group a true individual (though some might think that this solution would get rid a bit too easily of the vagueness problem raised by Clarke and Okasha).

Minus van Baalen (chapter 6) provides a much more permissive definition of what a unit of adaptation is than Gardner, together with an overview of the different ways through which more or less transient associations may persist in some form of biological individuality. Contrary to Gardner, Van Baalen claims that the alignment of interests between the parts of an association -- central to the constitution of this same association as a unit of adaptation -- is never perfectly achieved, and, thus, it is only the extent to which such an alignment is achieved that determines the status of the whole association as a unit of adaptation, as well as its robustness.

Huneman (chapter 7) investigates an interesting though largely neglected paradox concerning the emergence of new biological individuals from an evolutionary perspective. If an individual is primarily defined as a unit of adaptation, then one can only speak of a collective as an individual if there is some selection at this level that is not reducible to a lower level. But then how could we explain the emergence of a new unit of adaptation using a Darwinian perspective? Here, indeed, the multilevel selection framework cannot be applied, for there is not, properly speaking, any Darwinian competition between the first unit of adaptation at this new level and the other groups in the metapopulation at this same level (which are not yet units of adaptation but only mere collectives). Thus, it seems as if the emergence of a new level of biological individuality could not be properly explained within the very same framework that turns out to be the most used to justify the talk of adaptation at any new level. To solve this paradox, Huneman suggests as an alternative framework to the multilevel approach that of kin selection theory in order to allow the explanation of groups' adaptations from the viewpoint of their constituent parts. Indeed, in an evolutionary transition, the entities at the lower level (whose inclusive fitness is maximized by the emergence of a new group adaptation) can always be recognized as the former beneficiaries of this original adaptation, even if the population of groups is not yet fully constituted as a population of units of selection.

Finally, a last set of papers groups together the works which envisage the issue of individuality from a physiological perspective rather than from a strict evolutionary perspective. These papers insist on the kind of functional integration that a group must exhibit to be properly considered as a genuine individual.

Andrew Hamilton and Jennifer Fewell  (chapter 8) hold a distinctive position here, in some way at the crossroad of the evolutionary and the physiological approaches. According to them, the existence of a division of labor is the main functional feature of groups (e.g., social insects colonies), which are, moreover, genuine biological individuals. But the emergence of a division of labor also constitutes a distinctive evolutionary force, which cannot be reduced to mere selective processes, e.g., kin selection or classical multilevel selection. Thus, using interesting experiments on several artificial groups of solitary ant and bee foundresses, Hamilton and Fewell show that the expression of a division of labor within these groups (e.g., between excavation and brood care) is strongly context-dependent and cannot be reduced to mere genetic differences between the individuals. From these experiments they conclude that the group in those cases is truly an emergent individual. And although the presence of a division of labor has surely evolved through the action of some selection processes below the group level, they insist on the fact that this property is primarily the result of a self-organization of the parts (e.g., of two ant foundresses), whose emergence cannot be fully explained by assuming selection at the level of the individuals.

Thomas Pradeu (chapter 4) argues that the immune system constitutes the distinctive mark of biological organisms (in his view, the presence of a strict division of labor is only subsidiary). Having distinguished between mere biological individuals, (i.e., entities that are sufficiently well delimited and persistent through time to be counted as units according to a given biological process, e.g., natural selection), and organisms (defined as functionally integrated entities), Pradeu makes the claim that organisms are the most paradigmatic individuals. He then justifies this assumption first by showing that their immune system plays a central role in the integration of their heterogeneous parts, as for instance in the integration of the bacteria's gut with the rest of the multicellular body (the immune tolerance), and then by emphasizing the role played by the immune system in the evolution of organisms as a policing mechanism (e.g., in preventing the spreading of tumoral cells within multicellular individuals). Envisaged in this latter sense, the criterion proposed by Pradeu could well be generalized to other biological systems, such as unicellular organisms or even colonial entities, where some analog mechanisms of collective immunity have recently been observed.

Scott Turner's aim (chapter 10) is to extend the organism concept to colonial and symbiotic entities. As a case study, he envisages the example of the termites of the genus Macrotermes, which live in a huge mound acting as a respiratory organ for the colony (through promoting gas exchanges between the inside and the outside). Turner assimilates the whole colony into a superorganism, which maintains its functional integrity through a decentralized form of social cognition. Thus, for example, when the mound is damaged, the whole colony exhibits a coordinated and sophisticated homeostasis during which the functional system (i.e., both the mound itself and its function in stabilizing the gas exchanges) is restored by individual termites as it was before the perturbation.

Finally, Frédéric Bouchard (chapter 11) makes the link between Turner's physiological approach to the organism and its evolutionary dimension, thereby filling in the gap between the two kinds of perspectives. Unlike Turner, who focuses on the unity formed by the termites and their abiotic mound, Bouchard is primarily interested in explaining the functional unity of the symbiotic association between the termites of the genus Macrotermes and their fungal partners (cultivated within the nest by the termites in the so-called "fungus combs"). Bouchard agrees with Turner that homeostasis (i.e., the capacity of the whole to preserve its own physiology against the disturbing forces) is the key to individuality. But this characteristic, according to him, must actually be replaced in an evolutionary context and linked to the very concept of fitness; indeed, the persistence of function -- which makes a given symbiotic association a proper individual -- is also at the core of any evolutionary adaptation. This definition of fitness as persistence instead of reproduction, however, is rather unorthodox. But it may be the only way to reconcile the two fundamental aspects of biological individuals, namely their physiological and evolutionary dimensions.

To sum up, I would say that, while this collection will definitely be of interest to the specialist, its chief merit is perhaps providing an accessible and up-to-date synthesis of biological individuality in an evolutionary context. It offers an original and remarkably coherent perspective on this notion, focusing not only on its most philosophical aspects, but also on its multiple biological (e.g., evolutionary and physiological) facets. I strongly recommend it to all the biologists and philosophers who were once puzzled by this simple question: what is an organism?

[1] Buss, Leo. 1987. The Evolution of Individuality. Princeton: Princeton University Press.

[2] Bourke, Andrew. 2011. Principles of Social Evolution. Oxford: Oxford University Press.

[3] Calcott Brett and Kim Sterelny (eds.). 2011. The Major Transitions in Evolution Revisited. Cambridge: MIT Press.