From Individual to Collective Intentionality: New Essays

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Sara Rachel Chant, Frank Hindriks, and Gerhard Preyer (eds.), From Individual to Collective Intentionality: New Essays, Oxford University Press, 2014, 225pp., $74.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199936502.

Reviewed by Jennifer Lackey, Northwestern University


We attribute intentions to both individuals and to collective entities. Just as individuals do, groups might intend to break their promises or to honor their agreements or to draft a proposal. Moreover, our holding groups responsible for their actions often turns on our ability to properly attribute intentions to them, so there is a great deal at stake here. But how we understand these phenomena, and their relationship to one another, is far from straightforward. Can groups, for instance, have intentions that no individual member has? Is the rationality of groups wholly determined by the rationality of their members? How can collective entities perform actions when there is conflict among the intentions of the individuals?

These are some of the questions that are taken up in this collection edited by Sara Rachel Chant, Frank Hindriks, and Gerhard Preyer. It includes nine papers divided into two groups. The first five focus on issues related to collective attitudes and actions, while the remaining four are devoted to collective rationality. Some of the papers build on existing work, others apply interdisciplinary tools to key issues in the debates, while still others carve out new areas of inquiry. But all of the contributions are important reading for anyone interested in collective entities or the social world more broadly.

In the first paper, Deborah Tollefsen draws on the work of Elisabeth Pacherie to develop what she calls a dynamic theory of shared intention. According to Tollefsen, standard accounts recognize only shared future-directed intentions, but then cannot accommodate spontaneous or "on the fly" actions that occur without prior planning and commitment. Hence, she argues that we also need to recognize shared present-directed intentions. This is an interesting suggestion, though it may turn out that spontaneous actions can be captured by future-directed intentions after all. In particular, "on the fly" actions might be understood as having either very short planning stages or concrete general plans that do not involve specific subplans. For instance, you and I might spontaneously dance together, but there might still be a plan to do so; there just might be very little time that passes between planning and execution. Moreover, in order to have a future-directed intention, it doesn't need to be the case that we plan every detail of the action -- just as we might plan to go to Europe together but not have worked out every aspect of the trip, so, too, we might plan to dance together but not have a clear sense of every move. Shared future-directed intentions, then, might have the resources alone for capturing "on the fly" actions.

Kaarlo Miller and Raimo Tuomela offer an analysis of collective goals that draws on the work of Tuomela and has as an essential component that the members of the group in question collectively accept the goal. Frederick F. Schmitt objects to the widely held view that groups are capable of having only acceptances rather than proper beliefs. One of the key arguments that Schmitt focuses on is that belief in the individual case aims only at the truth but that group belief also aims at practical ends. This is taken to be strong support for the conclusion that groups do not have genuine beliefs. Schmitt calls this argument into question by describing various scenarios in which group belief can and does aim at the truth. But this dialectical strategy is puzzling, since the objection is that group belief, qua belief, should be such that it cannot fail to aim at the truth. What Schmitt needs to show, then, is that group belief always aims only at the truth.

Robert D. Rupert and Kirk Ludwig both raise important challenges to collective intentionality. While Rupert considers various arguments on behalf of the thesis that groups have cognitive states and finds them all to be wanting, Ludwig argues that there are no group agents and shows that claims that we make that suggest the contrary do not logically imply the existence of group agents.

Melinda Bonnie Fagan considers whether groups have irreducible scientific knowledge. She argues that though there aren't compelling arguments to establish this claim, it is important to ask not only whether individuals or groups possess the knowledge in question, but also how the knowledge is produced. And here she concludes that the production of scientific knowledge is an irreducibly collective process.

Abraham Sesshu Roth argues that there is a puzzle facing the defender of the discursive dilemma. Philip Pettit, who is one of the leading proponents of the importance of this dilemma, illustrates it by asking us to consider the following sort of case:

factory: Three employees of a factory are deciding whether to forgo a pay-raise in order to spend the saved money on implementing a set of workplace safety measures. The employees are supposed to make their decision on the basis of considering three separable issues: "first, how serious the danger is; second, how effective the safety measures that a pay-sacrifice would buy is likely to be; and third, whether the pay-sacrifice is bearable for members individually. If an employee thinks that the danger is sufficiently serious, the safety measure sufficiently effective, and the pay-sacrifice sufficiently bearable, he or she will vote for the sacrifice; otherwise he or she will vote against" (Pettit 2003, p. 171).[1] Imagine now that the factory's employees, E1-E3, vote in the following way:

Serious danger?           Effective measure?      Bearable loss?             Pay sacrifice?

            E1        Yes                              No                               Yes                              No      

            E2        No                               Yes                              Yes                              No

            E3        Yes                              Yes                              No                               No

In factory, all three members of the group intend to reject the pay sacrifice since each individual votes "No" in the conclusion column. However, the group itself might arrive at its collective intention via a premise-based aggregation procedure, whereby the group's intention is determined by the majority of votes found in the premise columns. The group's intention, then, is to accept the pay sacrifice since there are more "Yes"s than "No"s in each of the premise columns. In such a case, "the group will form [an intention][2] on the question of the pay-sacrifice that is directly in conflict with the unanimous vote of its members. It will form [an intention] that is in the starkest possible discontinuity with the corresponding [intentions] of its members" (Pettit 2003, p. 183). This divergence between the intention of a group and the intentions of its members motivates Pettit to conclude that groups are intentional subjects that are distinct from, and exist "over and beyond," their individual members.

The puzzle that Roth develops against the proponent of the discursive dilemma combines this result:

(1) groups can have intentions that no individual members have

with the following plausible thesis:

(2) groups can act only through the actions of their individual members.

Of course, (2) does not say that for every group, G, and act, a, G performs a only if at least one member of G performs a. It may be that one member performs action b, and another performs action c, and still another performs action d, which, when taken together, involves G performing a. But what (2) does say is that for every group, G, and act, a, G performs a only if at least one member of G performs some act or other that causally contributes to a. Herein lies the problem: how does a group φ through its individual members when none of them intends to φ? In factory, for instance, how does the group execute the action of accepting the pay sacrifice when every individual intends to reject it?

This puzzle is made all the more problematic by considering

(3) there is an intimate relationship that exists between intending and acting.

It is commonly thought that if one intends to φ, one is already in progress toward φ-ing. This is at least in part due to the fact that intending to φ is taken to be a settled state, one that is incompatible with continued deliberation about whether to φ. But if group action depends on individuals acting who, in turn, fail to have the relevant intention, then there will not be such a tight connection between intending and acting when groups are concerned. Thus, if we take (3) to be non-negotiable, then we have reason to reject either (1) or (2).

I want to suggest, however, that there are reasons to hold that the connection between intention and action is more fragile at the group level than it is at the individual level. To see this, note that intending to φ for a group is compatible with a fair bit of disagreement among individual members. Consider, for instance, the U.S. government's intention to implement the Affordable Care Act. Given that the Act passed and is being acted upon, it seems appropriate to attribute this intention to the U.S. government. But it certainly doesn't follow from this that the topic is settled in a way that is incompatible with deliberation. As we all know, it is still being hotly debated among members of the U.S. government. Or suppose that there is a majority vote for the Philosophy Department to hire a job candidate, which is then acted upon through making her an offer. It seems clear that the Philosophy Department intends to hire the job candidate, even though some of the members might still be deliberating about it as the offer is being extended. To the extent that this is different between individuals and groups, it might be explained by the often large, complex make-ups of the latter, as well as greater pressure for there to be a unified mind in the former. But the point that I wish to emphasize here is that it is open to a proponent of the discursive dilemma to provide a principled reason for accepting (1) and (2) while rejecting (3) with respect to collective entities.

According to Paul Weirich, "a group's act is rational if rational acts of its members constitute the group's act" (2014, p. 187), and thus he concludes that individual rationality entails collective rationality. As Weirich appreciates, however, there are immediate counterexamples facing such a view. For instance, suppose that individual investors each act rationally but jointly bring about an obviously untenable situation in the stock market, which ultimately collapses. Or consider, again, factory, where each employee votes rationally but collectively they bring about inconsistent results. In both cases, individually rational actions seem to give rise to collective irrationality.

Weirich resists this conclusion. Regarding the first sort of case, he argues that individually rational acts can generate bad results, such as a stock market collapse, but bad results are compatible with collective rationality. And with respect to factory, he claims that if we assume that the committee members have good reasons for remaining committed to the aggregation procedures in question and they "are willing to tolerate occasional inconsistencies, then inconsistencies arising from their rational votes are not collectively irrational" (2014, p. 204).

It is difficult to see how these are adequate responses, however. Bad results might indeed be compatible with collective rationality, but I take it that the original objection was that the particular kind of bad result at issue here is one of irrationality. Specifically, the claim is that while each individual makes a rational choice about the stock market, their acts lead to a collectively irrational result. This can be supported by assuming that the individuals would not act as they did were they to be privy to the end result, or that the outcome contains acts that together are incoherent, and so on. Moreover, the mere fact that an individual or a group has good reasons for adopting a procedure and is willing to live with certain consequences does not render the resulting act rational. I might have good reasons for sticking to my guns in the face of massive disagreement with my epistemic peers, and I might be willing to tolerate the occasional dogmatic response in myself, but surely this doesn't render me rational in retaining my belief.

But even if we grant Weirich's responses here, there is another sort of case that poses a particularly formidable challenge to his view. To see this, consider the following:

nursing home: Three nurses employed at a nursing home, N1-N3, constitute a single unit responsible for the care of patient O'Brien. Each is aware that she failed to give O'Brien one of his three required medications because of another patient's needs, but each also knows that her single act of negligence is not sufficient to put him in danger of death. At the same time, N1-N3 each knows that O'Brien missing all three of his medications would put him at serious risk of dying. However, because of systemic deficiencies in the nursing unit itself, N1 -N3 are not required to communicate with one another about the patients for whom they mutually care. Given this, N1-N3 do not share their respective acts with one another, and so each rationally believes that the other nurses successfully gave O'Brien his medicine.

In nursing home, N1-N3 each acts rationally when she fails to give O'Brien his medication. Indeed, we can even build into the case that the needs of the other patient are life-threatening and thus justify N1-N3 in focusing on him rather than on administering what they rationally believe is non-life-threatening care to O'Brien. The system itself, however, is deeply flawed by not having requirements in place to mandate communication between health care workers. This results in individual rationality giving rise to collective irrationality. This is not an uncommon phenomenon: members of corporations often have limited or compartmentalized knowledge that renders them oblivious to the problems of the system or structure to which they belong. Otherwise put, individuals are often rational cogs in irrational machines.

Finally, Julian Nida-Rümelin discusses collective intentions within a framework of structural rationality, according to which "an act can be rational if it is based on the motivation to conform to a certain pattern (or "structure") of actions" (p. 207, original italics). He claims that cooperation is best explained via collective intentionality -- in particular, in terms of a consensus that a particular action is acceptable to all.

In closing, let me say that while I have focused primarily on offering critical remarks on some of the papers, this is in large part because they provide so much rich material with which to engage. I hope and expect this volume not only to crucially impact current discussions about collective intentionality and related phenomena, but also to generate new insights in this important and fertile area of philosophy.[3]

[1] Pettit, Philip. 2003. "Groups with Minds of Their Own," in Frederick Schmitt (ed.), Socializing Metaphysics. New York: Rowman and Littlefield: 167-93.

[2] Pettit here talks about judgments, but it is clear that the discursive dilemma applies to intentions, too.

[3] I am grateful to Nick Leonard and Baron Reed for discussing the papers in this volume with me.