From Individual to Plural Agency: Collective Action: Volume 1

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Kirk Ludwig, From Individual to Plural Agency: Collective Action: Volume 1, Oxford University Press, 2016, 316pp., $85.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780198755623.

Reviewed by Raimo Tuomela, University of Helsinki (Emeritus)/University of Munich


Kirk Ludwig's book contains two parts that together constitute Volume 1 of his projected two-volume work. The second volume will cover institutional and mob action. The present book consists of eighteen chapters the titles of which give an overview of the contents of the book: Part I: 1. The Problem of Collective Agency, 2. What is an Event?, 3. The Logical Form of Singular Action Sentences, 4. Action, Motivation, Explanation, and Intention, 5. Conditional Intentions, 6. What is it to be the Agent of an Event or State?, 7. The Content of I-Intentions, 8. The Adverb 'Intentionally'.

Part II: 9. Logical Form of Plural Action Sentences, 10. Extensions and Explanations, 11. Consequences, Collective Actions, Illustrative Cases, 12. What are Shared Group Intentions?, 13. The Distinctive Content of We-Intentions, 14. Some Initial Objections and Replies, 15. Collective Intentional Behavior, 16. Relation to Other Accounts, 17. Does the Account Require More of Collective Action than is Reasonable?, 18. Conclusion.

The book is rich in content and extensive in scope. There are useful summaries in (and of) both parts. On the whole, the book is an exceptionally well-argued, high-level contribution to analytic single-agent and plural-agent action theory. (Social groups are here viewed as plural agents, and they thus ontologically consist of a collection of single agents who generally are capable of shared we-intendings by which they act together in specific ways.)

The first part develops an analysis of individual action, agency, and intention, with special attention to the logical form of singular action sentences (using Ludwig's example, "He melted the chocolate"), the content of intentions directed at individual actions ("He intended to melt the chocolate"), and the logical role of the modifier "intentionally" in action sentences ("He melted the chocolate intentionally"). The account is built on a refinement and extension of Donald Davidson's event analysis of singular action sentences.[1] In Ludwig's account the action verb is treated as introducing two quantifiers over events. To say that he melted the chocolate is to say (roughly) that he did something (was the immediate agent of some event) that brought it about that the chocolate melted (that an event of melting of the chocolate occurred).

The second part develops an account of plural discourse about collective action and intention. It focuses on an account of the logical form of plural action sentences ("We built a bridge") and on sentences attributing "we-intentions" to action ("We intended to build the bridge") as well as on the content of individuals' intentions (viz. "we-intentions") when they are engaged in joint intentional action. The account is also concerned with the logical role of "intentionally" as a modifier in plural action sentences ("We built a bridge intentionally").

Plural action sentences are typically ambiguous between a distributive and a collective reading, where the ambiguity is due to quantifier scope ambiguity but not lexical ambiguity concerning intending (pp. 187, 189). "At a sports event we sang the national anthem to open the event" could be read as saying that we each did so (distributive reading), or as saying that we did so together (collective reading). More precisely, on the distributive reading, for each of us there is an event of which he is the sole agent and it is the singing of the national anthem. We get the collective reading, on Ludwig's account, essentially by reversing the order of the quantifiers. On the collective reading, there is an event, viz. a singing of the national anthem, of which each of us is an agent. Here group agency involves multiple agents of a single event, not an event of which there is a single group agent. For Ludwig a central point here is that, on this analysis, the superficial appearance that there is a group agent -- the we as the apparent agent in the surface form of the sentence -- disappears. Yet in both the distributive and the collective reading the we is present but not as an agent. Only the members of the we (the group) are agents of anything.

Ludwig claims:

Collective intentional action is the most fundamental form of social reality. Every social institution, relation, practice, or interaction rests upon the capacity of groups of individuals to engage in various forms of collective intentional behavior. A fundamental understanding [of] the social requires an understanding of the nature of collective agency and of how the various aspects of the social world are grounded in it. (p. 2)

Shortly thereafter we read: "My goal is to provide an account of the basic conceptual structures that are involved in collective agency" (p. 8). Our foundational understanding of social reality, according to Ludwig, depends on understanding the nature of collective intentional behavior and how it differs from individual intentional behavior. He relies on the following two principles (paraphrased from page 6):

(1) An account of collective intentional behavior should be built on an understanding of individual intentional behavior, and more complex forms of collective institutional behavior, including institutional action, should be understood in terms of more basic forms of collective intentional behavior.

(2) The account should be built on a proper understanding of the logical form of the sentences we use to express our thoughts about collective action, shared intentions, and collective intentional behavior.

Ludwig points out that principle (2) "rests on the assumption that the logical and conceptual resources of our discourse about the social are fitted to the phenomena we use it to talk about" (p. 7). Laying bare the logical form of our discourse tells us the fundamental ontology of the domain we are interested in.

The assumed and argued-for fact that the plural subject group is not an agent, but that only its members are, can be employed when giving an account of the content of the we-intentions of the agents (members) who participate in joint intentional action. We learn that a we-intention is an intention of an individual that is directed toward an action of his while at the same time purporting to contribute to a collective action in which that individual has a part, which itself results from everyone having the same collective action plan associated with his intention when he acts as part of the group (p. 201). Ludwig's account draws only on the conceptual resources already available from our understanding of individual intentions. It is argued that this account makes it possible to explain the logical role of the predicate "intentionally" in collective action sentences, and so to provide a general account of collective intentional action. A group acts intentionally when its members we-intend that they do something and carry out their intentions successfully (p. 229).

Ludwig assumes that the logical form of collective action descriptions contains central information about the ontology of collective action and relevant mental notions -- much as we do it in our common folk psychology (p. 7). Is this a tenable assumption? It seems to ignore the criticism of folk psychology and people's common intuitions and views about psychological matters presented (by Stephen Stich, Matthew Ratcliffe, and others) in recent decades. These critics argue that folk psychology is not correct and needs to be radically revised to be a reliable guide for scientific social theorizing. (I am not claiming here that Ludwig uncritically accepts folk psychological claims.) To defend Ludwig, it is doubtful whether the above criticism, even if true, would have much bite on Ludwig's technical developments, although it might conceivably affect the social ontology involved his theory.

Ludwig's account of the logical form of action discourse is Davidsonian at bottom but goes further and considerably extends and refines Davidson's individualistic account based on events and event causation. A central achievement of the book is that it gives detailed and innovative technical representations of many central notions and phenomena that action theory is about, although this takes place in individualistic terms and without the assumption of a sui generis "we-mode" or the like notions (see pp. 189-190 for Ludwig's claim that the "we-mode" is "mysterious" and also see note 2 below). The book purports to show that collective action can be appropriately analyzed in terms of individualistic notions.

Let us now consider Ludwig's example of collective national anthem singing in Chapter 9:

We sang the national anthem intentionally.

This sentence can be understood either distributively (viz. individualistically) or non-distributively (viz. collectively). On the distributive reading the members of "we" sang the anthem separately or severally, while in the collective case they sang the anthem jointly so that each of us nevertheless is in the agency relation to the end result of the anthem having been sung (p. 135).

Here groups are not taken to be agents in a strict sense, basically because they are not capable of performing "primitive" (or, equivalently, "basic") actions and of having de re intentions-in-action. Although I take Ludwig here to be right in principle, groups can be agents in a slightly looser sense (which also Ludwig seems to admit e.g. on pp. 176-177), viz. in the sense of construing a group's action in an approximated sense as a kind of mereological sum of its members' (primitive) actions, which sum yet falls short of the members acting in the we-mode -- the we-mode is a richer notion in that it requires some additional crucial features (see note 2 below). In my own theorizing (Social Ontology, OUP, 2013, ch. 2), I argue slightly differently that the "we" (as a we mode we-group) in the above kind of case may yet have the capacity to act approximately as a group through its members' actions. Thus it might tentatively be regarded as an approximate functional group agent (an entity that approximately functions like a true agent) -- but not one with a group mind in an old-fashioned, e.g. Gierkean, sense.

We-intention is a central element in Ludwig's account (see Chapter 13) and also in a somewhat different sense in my own account that in contrast to his content-based account uses "thick" we-mode we-intentions (e.g. in my 2013 book, see also note 2), but my own account is an "enriched" account construed in part in terms of the we-mode. It does not agree with Ludwig's thesis that we-intentions should be analyzed solely on the basis of concepts which are already in play in understanding individual intentional action. I argue that we-mode we-intentions are in many cases needed for social theorizing and that the we-mode/I-mode approach is needed for the best description and explanation of the social world. My account covers more ground than Ludwig's theory does or seems to do.[2]

Ludwig's account does not aim at reducing collective items to individualistic entities and phenomena. Yet collective discourse is assumed by him to be individualistically reducible. Nevertheless, if collective discourse indeed is reducible and if, as he claims, (preanalytic) collective discourse is about as correct as individualistic discourse and does fit the ontology it is tracking (p. 7), it then seems that his account after all is also ontologically reductive. Given Ludwig's underlying intuitive source of theorizing, viz. experimentally untested folk psychology (this is a critical point applying to most current theorizing about action), one may ask if this is a rich enough basis to guide the search for the correct social ontology.

Let me next non-technically illustrate Ludwig's account of "thin" we-intentions in terms of his example of singing the national anthem together, partly in his and partly in my phrasing. Here it is (based on page 204):

For all members of a group G it holds that a member x we-intends to perform action A with G if and only if x intends that (the members of) G perform A in accordance with a shared plan when participating in the collective intentional behavior A and also intends that the group through its members will do something according to the shared plan that also x contributes to, where sharing a plan amounts to all the members' intending that there is a plan each of them has when acting and that they participate in the action A in accordance with the plan.

Chapter 16 critically discusses John Searle's, Margaret Gilbert's, Michael Bratman's, and David Velleman's as well as my own account of collective intentions. Ludwig's theory bears most similarity to Bratman's account.

On the whole Ludwig's theory is well argued -- in terms of normal philosophical or logical argumentation -- and his points against other authors are usually well taken. He is a sharp critic, typically with good arguments. While his book is not light reading, it is rewarding especially for those who are interested in technical analyses. Also other philosophers will find his discussions interesting. Ludwig normally goes right into the core of important issues, and does not shy away from saying what he thinks about particular views or arguments. Undoubtedly the book is a great achievement and is strongly recommended for action theorists.


I wish to thank my wife Maj Tuomela, Kaarlo Miller, Raul Hakli, and the other members of a reading group studying Ludwig's book for comments on a draft of this review.

[1] Unfortunately there is no comparison in the book between Ludwig's refined Davidsonian kind of theorizing and the "operator-based" accounts of action, e.g. by Georg Henrik von Wright, Ingmar Pörn, Brian Chellas, Nuel Belnap, and others. Mostly the type of action discussed in the book is that of bringing about. Usually bringing about in Ludwig's analyses is based on an agent's or the agents' intention state that is taken to causally bring about the e.g. actions (and their outcomes). Let me note that there is nothing in the book about the important notion of "stit", viz. seeing to it that something will be the case. A reader may wonder what event causation would amount to in this context.

[2] I have argued that we-mode we-intentions are functionally better than pro-group I-mode intentions and actions in several contexts and thus seem needed for an accurate description and explanation of the social world. (See my 2013 Social Ontology and Hakli, Miller, and Tuomela, "Two kinds of We-Reasoning" Economics and Philosophy, 2010 vol. 26, pp. 291-320). Ludwig's account of we-intentions may be acceptable for a "thin" notion of we-intending but it does not capture e.g. my notion of "thick" we-mode we-intention that also involves strong "groupish" and "togetherness" features that may exist in addition to the content features of thin we-intentions. These special additional groupish features are in part incorporated in the group-social manner or way of behaving as a "we" (i.e. as a we-mode group), in contrast to many I's when pursuing the we-intention, and they can be taken to be part of the satisfaction conditions and content of the (we-mode) we-intention. I have recently sketched the we-mode as a logically second-order attitude and as related to the way or manner of doing things and as fulfilling the three requirements of the presence of a group reason, collective commitment to a shared ethos and to the other members, and the satisfaction of a special collectivity condition. This kind of we-mode we-intentions are needed (and supersede thin I-mode we-intentions) at least in some cases of jointly intentionally performed collective action and do it especially in Paretian collective action dilemmas (Tuomela, 2013, ch. 7). See also Preyer and Peter (eds.), Social Ontology and Collective Intentionality, Critical Essays on the Philosophy of Raimo Tuomela with His Responses, 2017, Springer, esp. pp. 74-75, for my discussion of the we-mode as a second-order mode. My account accordingly contrasts with Ludwig's view of we-intentions that does not accept my kind of use of the notion of mode (p. 190). Contrary to Ludwig's claim the we-mode can be seen as a "non-mysterious", group-involving mode.