From Morality to Mental Health: Virtue and Vice in a Therapeutic Culture

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Mike W. Martin, From Morality to Mental Health: Virtue and Vice in a Therapeutic Culture, Oxford University Press, 2006, 234pp., $29.95 (hbk), ISBN 9780195304718.

Reviewed by Judith Andre, Michigan State University


In Meaningful Work, published in 2000, Mike Martin took practical ethics beyond its usual preoccupation with duties and dilemmas, to talk instead about commitments and ideals -- about virtues.  The book was important and welcome.  Martin's present work is a worthy successor.

His subject is the common worry that moral frameworks are being replaced by therapeutic ones, that dishonesty and cruelty, for instance, have been recast as sickness rather than as wrongdoing.  Martin finds this worry groundless; in fact, he argues, morality and therapy require and enrich each other.  Fears to the contrary spring from oversimplified, distorted understandings of each.  For although some therapy is entirely self-oriented, most is not; and while some moral frameworks are oppressive, most contribute to a fully realized life.

In a discussion ranging from Plato to recent culture wars, Martin makes three major points: "(1) sound morality is healthy; (2) we are [in many respects] responsible for our health, mental as well as physical; and (3) moral values permeate psychotherapy and conceptions of mental health." (4)  This position is both wise and significant; if Martin is right, as I think he is, a great deal of contemporary discussion is wrong-headed.  Martin himself would put it more mildly; a hallmark of the book is the quietness of its tone, the respect with which Martin treats those he criticizes.  But respect never makes him timid; his analyses show courage as well as insight.

Cultural critics today from both left and right worry that what has been termed the "therapeutic turn" erases issues of character and responsibility.  Martin believes that what is happening is not a replacement of morality by therapy, but a transformation of our moral understanding, a transformation which does not erase guilt but makes it one consideration among others, which regards some therapeutic techniques as means toward moral growth, and which pays new attention to positive ideals such as love, compassion, and forgiveness.  Martin's purpose in this book is to articulate the integration which he believes is developing, and to offer an enriched language for discussing good, full human lives.

Martin's moral framework draws especially from pragmatism and virtue ethics, although he believes that other moral theories, like that of Kant, are also necessary.  His pragmatism is largely that of William James and John Dewey; Dewey's suspicion of dichotomies, and especially of the distinction between moral and natural goods, is evident everywhere.  Martin has interesting things to say about determinism, and makes good use of current work on moral communities of reciprocity and recognition.

The book is divided into four parts: the first lays out the author's general theory; the second looks at his position on responsibility; the third discusses behavior patterns, like alcoholism, once called sinful, now (also) called pathologies; the fourth unites psychology and morality in a discussion of what counts as a good human life.

Part I begins with Plato: "virtue is the health and comeliness and well-being of the soul; wickedness is disease, deformity, and weakness." (17)  This interweaving of virtue and health has been rejected as confused, but Martin believes Plato had it right.  In their definitions as well as their extension, health and goodness involve one another.  In the DSM, for instance (the American Psychiatric Association's Diagnostic and Statistical Manual of Mental Disorders), the definitions of disease in general and of most disorders in particular are implicitly moral evaluations.  What makes a pattern of behavior "excessive," "inappropriate," or "maladaptive" is often a failure to respect what makes lives good; which is to say, a moral failure.  Furthermore, criteria of mental health contain components like self-respect, integrity, authenticity, and responsibility; these are moral terms.

Not all mental illness counts as moral defect; organically-based psychopathology and mild phobias are obvious exceptions.  Correspondingly, minor moral lapses need not suggest emotional problems, and great moral achievements -- heroism, saintliness -- cannot be reduced to robust mental health.  But in two areas mental and moral health overlap fundamentally: basic habits of responsibility, and what Martin calls "positive health."  Each area receives extensive attention later in the book.

None of this is to deny that morality in distorted forms can be a sickness; the author accepts much of the criticism laid by Nietzsche and Freud.  He rejects, however, their egoism and their repudiation of guilt, which, he argues, plays a positive role in both health and morality.  Martin also finds in each writer implicit moral commitments: Freud values compassion, truthfulness, and the ability to love and work; Nietzsche affirms self-love, self-mastery, and vitality.

In Part II Martin discusses responsibility, a central focus for worry about the therapeutic turn.  It's true that the "sick role" identified by Talcott Parsons absolves the sick of responsibility for their condition.  Martin shows, however, that we justifiably hold people at least partially responsible for the occurrence of many diseases, physical and mental alike.  Ways of living contribute to heart disease and lung cancer, for instance; personal choices contribute to emotional problems as well.  It is also true that society holds the sick responsible for cooperating with treatment.

One motivation for calling destructive behavior patterns diseases is to free people from paralyzing guilt.  Martin argues that self-righteous or destructive blame is objectionable not just therapeutically but morally as well, and that blame, if it is compassionate and judicious, can help one make sense of the world and find peace within it.  Therapists recognize that it is important to find the ways, however minor, in which the patient contributed to her own illness, because those areas are subject to her control, and so are fruitful areas for hope and healing.  Finding those areas can be done constructively rather than judgmentally.

Outside the professional arena, Martin acknowledges that "self-help" groups can allow people to evade responsibility, but he believes that the same can be true of religion, family, politics and other areas of life.  But all of these, and self-help groups as well, can support courage, honesty, and commitment.  Nor is Martin worried that the self-esteem sought therapeutically is too self-centered.  It is one good among others, resembling the authenticity and autonomy valued in moral philosophy.  Some self-help movements drift toward selfishness, but in many ways they value and even require community.

In Part III, "Wrongdoing as Sickness," Martin integrates moral and therapeutic approaches to five kinds of destructive behavior: alcoholism, pathological gambling, crime, violence, and bigotry.  His discussion of alcoholism serves as a template for the other areas.  First, those who call alcoholism a disease do so in order to promote healing.  The classification encourages people to seek help, offers them hope, and creates a helpful therapeutic environment.  On the other hand, those who insist that alcoholism has a moral component are insisting on accountability, on encouraging people to take responsibility for their choices.  These two sets of goals are not mutually exclusive.  Martin shows that writers on both sides of this issue agree on many things: that genetics and environment create susceptibility, but not inevitability; that alcoholics can control parts of their lives, even some aspects of their drinking, but lack general overall control; that they need help.  Almost everyone also agrees that alcoholics have some responsibilities: to avoid causing harm (e.g., through impaired driving), to make amends when they do hurt others, and to get help.  Martin would prefer the word "sickness" to "disease," because the former, more colloquial term, suggests a moral dimension, where the latter, more clinical term, does not.

Pathological gambling is also an addiction, and after a careful study of arguments put forth for a moral/medical dichotomy in this sphere, Martin again concludes that although the condition includes impaired agency, the impairment does not count as an excuse for the harm compulsive gamblers cause: for the draining of their families’ budgets, for the theft to which they sometimes turn, for the debts they cannot pay.  And in fact Gamblers Anonymous, like Alcoholics Anonymous and like good therapy, insists that members take responsibility for repairing the harm they have caused, in the first instance by repaying debts.  Therein lies an inconsistency: "It is implausible to say that individuals are complete victims, entirely lacking in responsibility for the 'disease' of gambling and yet fully [responsible] for its harmful consequences." (106)  Here as elsewhere we not only can have it both ways, we must.  Gambling is both a disease and a moral failing, and means of dealing with it include accepting some responsibility.

Martin's examination of crime reaches similar conclusions.  Discussions of crime, he argues, are often distorted by the assumption that therapy and punishment are incompatible.  He finds Karl Menninger's The Crime of Punishment, for instance, both confused conceptually and ineffective in practice.  Nevertheless Martin agrees that many criminals face special obstacles in controlling their impulses, and judges and juries should take this into account.  "Therapy-oriented rehabilitation is one component in a justified system of punishment," not an alternative to it (116).  And while sympathy is appropriate for those, for instance, whose adult behavior is strongly shaped by their childhoods, antipathy is also natural and justified.  Resentment is a strong motivator for fighting injustice; attempts to feel nothing but dispassionate love might increase hostility by frustrating normal human emotions.  "Ambivalence is not incoherence … the tension between blame and compassion … is within morality itself, not between morality and therapy." (126-27)  This is a theme to which he returns.

Part III ends with a discussion of bigotry, particularly "visceral bigotry": deeply irrational, deeply entrenched prejudices serving central emotional needs, and leading to injustice, violence and atrocity.  Once again Martin sets out to resolve the apparent contradiction between therapeutic and moral approaches, and as always he carefully examines the relevant literature.  Current psychological theory shows that prejudice results from ordinary psychological mechanisms, but Martin replies that once prejudice becomes virulent, it is as such pathological.  As always, however, this judgment of pathology is compatible with moral condemnation, with assigning moral responsibility.

Part IV moves to more positive issues.  "Meaningful lives embody defensible values" (141).  Martin focuses first on depression, arguing that it "can be simultaneously pathological and insight-provoking," and that recovery requires both serotonin levels and the restoration of meaningful relationships (151).  Again he finds moral values, usually forward rather than backward-looking, implicit in therapy: forgive yourself, care for yourself, be courageous, accept responsibility.

Self-deception, it is now believed, contributes to emotional well-being; this would seem to be a clear conflict between moral and therapeutic values.  Although Martin rejects some interpretations of the relevant research, he accepts the likelihood of some tension -- but, as before, among moral values rather than between them and therapeutic goals.  Love, hope, and honesty are all at issue; sometimes one must give way for another.  Love, so crucial to mental health, receives a separate chapter.  Love requires many virtues, among them fairness, respect, caring, and responsibility.  Marital therapy in particular recognizes these facts.

The chapter on meaningful work draws upon Martin Seligman's concept of 'positive psychology,' as well as Martin's own important earlier work.  Seligman identifies core virtues from the major moral tradition: "courage, love, justice, temperance, and self-transcendence (identification with communities)" (180).  Satisfying work requires and promotes all of these.  Martin acknowledges that forces of globalization are making meaningful work less available: alienation is inherent in insecure and temporary work.  Integrating morality and mental health, he argues, will help us cope, but cannot fully counter the objective realities.

In community service Martin finds a significant convergence of self-interest and the good of the community; both require gratitude, compassion, justice, and hope.  To the criticism that therapy emphasizes emotions at the expense of moral values, he replies that "feeling good in helping others is a presumptive sign of genuine caring." (186)

Finally, Martin describes the 'culture wars' as a "polarized, confusing, and yet creative context" for exploring the ways in which therapy helps with the moral project rather than replacing it.  He does not deplore the politicizing of these issues; to the contrary, he finds the therapeutic trend far too important to separate from politics.  The contesting of ideals is intrinsic to democracy.  But the polarization and confusion will be less if we, following Martin, make our discussions specific.

This is a fine book, significant, original, practical, and well written.  It deserves to be widely read.  If taken to heart, Martin's thesis will take us beyond today's oversimplified controversies and allow us to talk about, and seek together, the virtue of which Plato wrote: virtue as the comeliness and well-being of the soul.