From Morality to Metaphysics: The Theistic Implications of our Ethical Commitments

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Angus Ritchie, From Morality to Metaphysics: The Theistic Implications of our Ethical Commitments, Oxford University Press, 2012, 198pp., $55.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199652518.

Reviewed by John E. Hare, Yale Divinity School


The first thing to say is that I am broadly sympathetic with the goal of this book, which is to argue the merits of a theistic grounding of our ability to track moral truth. I have tried to argue a similar case for other fundamental moral beliefs myself.

I have some hesitations, however. The first is that the book is very badly edited. There are errors from the first sentence on ('What are the raw materials which "moral truth" is constructed?'), including eight in the first eight pages. Some of the errors are in spelling or grammar, and some seriously distort the philosophical content. Oxford University Press has a tradition of excellent proofreading, with a reliable troop of readers who have the competence and diligence to weed out this sort of thing. I do not know what happened in this case, but in any case the author must bear a large share of the blame.

The second hesitation is about Ritchie's understanding of expressivism. He is not alone in the way he has characterized this school of thought, but I think he is mistaken nonetheless. He defines expressivism as the view which takes "'moral truth' to be constituted by our sentiments and passions." (70). He quotes with approval Philippa Foot's reaction to the Nazi terror:

In the face of the news of the concentration camps, I thought 'it just can't be the way Stevenson, Ayer, and Hare say it is, that morality in the end is just the expression of an attitude.' . . . For, fundamentally, there is no way, if one takes this line, that one could imagine oneself saying to a Nazi, 'but we are right, and you are wrong' with there being any substance to the statement. (36)

Ritchie takes R. M. Hare to have been a non-cognitivist, which R. M. Hare himself several times emphatically denied (e.g., Sorting Out Ethics, Oxford: Clarendon Press, 1997, 56). The basic problem is that Ritchie has not decided his own position about internalism in ethical theory. R. M. Hare was an internalist about moral judgment, but the question about the ontological status of value properties is a separate question.

A third hesitation is about Ritchie's use of or failure to use the history of philosophy. Again he is not alone in the attempt to do philosophy exclusively from contemporary materials. But this method has drawbacks. I will give just one example. Ritchie undertakes to show the failures of axiarchism, the view that the good has a causal role, making things to be a certain way just because it is good for them to be that way. This is a version of final causation, and is familiar to anyone who knows Aristotelian metaphysics. When Ritchie comes to discuss axiarchism without divine purposes, which is Aristotle's position, Aristotle is not mentioned. The whole move from teleology in nature (what was called in the nineteenth century 'teleonomy') to teleology confined to the purposes of designers (as in Duns Scotus, for example) is examined as though there had not been centuries of discussion about it. These centuries provide all sorts of distinctions and arguments that make sense of why we now have the conceptual apparatus we do.

When all this has been said by way of caution, however, the book is nonetheless highly useful. The basic argument is that we need some way to explain how our faculties could have the ability to track moral truth. Ritchie appeals here to canons governing inference to the best explanation, which he argues are basic to our thinking considered as a whole, including the practice of science. According to those canons, he argues, appealing to the purposes of a divine designer is a better explanation than any of the currently familiar alternatives. Ritchie does an excellent job of laying out what these alternatives are and exposing their various weaknesses.

There is one thing in particular I want to commend, namely his reply to the claim that we can find an explanation for our ability to track moral truth in evolutionary biology. His reply is complex. He starts by comparing the evolutionary account of the development of the focused-lens eye provided by Dan-Erik Nilsson and Susanne Pelger ('A Pessimistic Estimate of the Time Required for an eye to Evolve,' Proceedings of the Royal Society of London, Biological Sciences 256 (1994) 53-8) with the theist account of William Paley. Nilsson and Pelger provide a fully intelligible explanation for the present state of affairs, just as Paley does, but without postulating any intentional activity. Ritchie then acknowledges that natural selection through adaptation may directly produce comparatively little of our cognitive capacity, most of which may (following Stephen Jay Gould and Richard C. Lewontin) be best accounted for as a spandrel effect. But the problem is that we need some way to justify the belief that what is produced in the spandrel, especially our beliefs about what is objectively right, harmonizes with what is in our interest as survivors and replicators and (perhaps) pleasure seekers. Ritchie puts this problem in terms of a dilemma. Either there is some less obvious way is which these beliefs are justified because they promote survival, replication, and pleasure, or there is not. If there is, a value system based on these three qualities alone is morally objectionable, and at odds with our fundamental moral commitments (the belief, for example, that protecting the weak and vulnerable has final and not merely instrumental value). If there is not, then the valuations in question have no evolutionary purpose; but then evolution cannot explain how they track the truth. Ritchie assumes in this argument that our theoretical cognitive capacities do have an adaptive pay-off (and he assumes that Alvin Plantinga's skepticism about this is unjustified). He therefore has to assume also that our practical cognitive capacities cannot be reduced to the theoretical. But in arguing for this second assumption he is, I think, entirely successful.

I have a few quibbles about individual figures in Ritchie's account, and I will mention just two. First, I think Ritchie needs to acknowledge the possibility John McDowell promotes: that value properties are independent of any particular human cognizer, but not independent of human cognition in general. In this way, McDowell thinks value properties are like color properties. My objection is that in earlier sections of the book (e.g., 19f and 27f) Ritchie assumes he can rule out this position, and then when he actually comes to discuss McDowell, he has no argument against him. He proposes, rather, to assume McDowell is right, and argues that we still need a way to explain how our cognitive faculties track moral truth. McDowell follows one reading of Wittgenstein, according to which there is no sense in seeking for a justification from outside our practices as a whole. Ritchie thinks there is sense, and a burden of explanation remains. As far as I can see, McDowell can agree that our present standards of justification call for such an explanation, but he thinks that is a mistake, and our present standards need to be revised. There is no way for Ritchie to defeat this position on the grounds of our present standards. But it is notoriously hard to settle disagreements about where the 'burden' lies. Perhaps Ritchie is entitled at least to the claim that if he can show that McDowell still has the burden, he can also show that McDowell cannot meet it.

The other quibble is about Robert M. Adams. Ritchie attributes to Adams the view that because God is loving, God will perform the most loving action (169). But Adams would deny the maximization thesis implied here. More importantly, Ritchie thinks that if we ground moral obligation in God's character as loving, that means we do not ground it in God's will. Adams would deny the dichotomy here, because he thinks that God's willing and God's character are necessarily harmonious (Finite and Infinite Goods, Oxford: Oxford University Press, 1999, 47f). For Adams, God does constitute our obligations by command, which is an expression of will, but it is the expression of a loving will, not an arbitrary one (except in the antique sense of 'arbitrary' in which it means 'within a person's discretion,' in Latin arbitrium).

These quibbles (and a few others) aside, this is an excellent book, well worth reading. It does the discipline an important service by laying out elegantly and succinctly the arguments in favor of the thesis that a theistic explanation of our capacity to track moral truth is more successful than its rivals.