From Natural Character to Moral Virtue in Aristotle

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Mariska Leunissen, From Natural Character to Moral Virtue in Aristotle, Oxford University Press, 2017, 216pp., $74.00, ISBN 9780190602215.

Reviewed by David Bronstein, Georgetown University


It’s all about blood.

This is one of the main conclusions of Mariska Leunissen’s excellent and important new book on the biological basis of Aristotle’s theory of moral virtue. Because moral virtues such as courage and moderation develop out of our natural character traits, which are largely the result of our physiology, which rests ultimately on the material composition of our blood, moral virtue has its origin in blood. If you have the right kind of blood — i.e., hot and thin, like that of Greek men — your chances of achieving moral virtue are good. If you don’t — if your blood is hot and thick, like that of the spirited but stupid northern barbarians, or cold and thin, like that of the cowardly but intelligent southern barbarians, or, worst of all, cold and thick, like that of women, who are naturally cowardly and stupid — your chances of achieving virtue are slim. Furthermore, since the composition of one’s blood is determined partly by environment, including climate, where you live has a significant impact on your chances of achieving moral virtue. It turns out, then, that there are, for Aristotle, what Leunissen calls ‘morally unlucky groups’ who have little to no chance of achieving moral virtue and living happy, flourishing lives. It turns out, in other words, that whether one becomes virtuous and happy is largely a matter of luck. Significantly, women, barbarians, and ‘natural slaves’ are among these morally unlucky groups. Full moral virtue is for free-born, male Greek citizens alone. For just about everyone else, bad luck.

Although many of these claims are already familiar, Leunissen argues for them in such a fresh and convincing manner that it makes it hard to (continue to) ignore them. As someone who regularly teaches Aristotle’s ethics as a plausible and inspiring moral theory, this book made me question whether I am right to do so.

Leunissen’s book has a substantial introduction, six chapters, and a conclusion. I’ll first provide an overview of the main lines of argument and then conclude with some broader reflections.

According to Leunissen, to understand fully Aristotle’s account of moral development we need to see that he distinguishes among (a) natural character traits, (b) natural virtues, and (c) full moral virtue (xix). A natural character trait is a capacity for certain emotions and actions, one that can be developed either toward natural virtue or toward natural vice (e.g., spiritedness). A natural virtue too is a capacity for certain emotions and actions, but one that results from the frequent exercise of the corresponding natural character trait toward virtue (e.g., courage). (Note that a natural virtue is acquired, not innate, and exists in an agent who has not achieved full moral virtue — it is what you have if you’ve become, for example, just and courageous but not moderate or practically wise. Confusingly, then, the expression ‘natural virtue’ in Nicomachean Ethics (henceforth NE) VI.13 refers not to this but to natural character, as Leunissen notes, 128-9.) Finally, full moral virtue is ‘a unified psychological disposition involving full character virtue and practical wisdom that results from successful habituation.’ (xix)

Chapter 1 goes back to the origin of moral development and examines the physiology of natural character. Leunissen argues for the importance of an animal’s material nature, especially the composition of its blood and the level of its internal heat, in determining which natural character traits it has. Chapter 2 then takes up the malleability of natural character traits, arguing that factors such as diet, aging, disease, and environment influence our natural character prior to the time at which moral habituation properly begins. Since these factors are outside of our control, so partly is our moral development. Members of morally unlucky groups are disadvantaged from the start, and members of morally lucky groups may also face obstacles to virtue, if at a young age they are fed the wrong kinds of food or even exposed to the wrong kinds of music. (There are Platonic precedents for many of these claims in Timaeus 86b-87d.)

Chapters 3 and 4 examine natural character and moral development from the point of view of the ruler of the ideal city, as described in the Politics. One of the ruler’s tasks is to identify the citizens who have the best chances of achieving full moral virtue. Since this is determined largely by natural character, it is in the ruler’s interest to attempt to infer natural character traits from an individual’s visible features. Hence, chapter 3 examines the science of physiognomy in Aristotle and his contemporaries and argues that ‘although Aristotle does not develop a systematic physiognomic theory himself, he nevertheless provides the scientific groundwork for such a theory and also uses — if sparsely — rudimentary physiognomic methods and assumptions in his biology and moral psychology.’ (61) The ruler must also try to ensure that there are new citizens born with a good chance of achieving moral virtue. Hence, chapter 4 examines Aristotle’s eugenics program in the Politics and its basis in his theory of sexual reproduction in the Generation of Animals. Leunissen concludes that

the recommendations Aristotle gives in the Politics to lawgivers for how they should regulate marriage and childbirth in the ideal city . . . conform to the biological facts presented in the biological treatises concerning the physiological conditions Aristotle believes are most likely to produce perfect, male offspring. (90)

Aristotle famously thinks that one acquires moral virtue by ‘habituation’: one becomes just by knowingly doing just things, eventually for the right reasons. Leunissen thinks that in addition to this ‘psychological’ account of habituation in NE II.1-6, there is evidence in the Politics, the Physics, and the biological works of a ‘physiological’ account of habituation according to which factors such as one’s sex, diet, exercise, music, climate, and environment play significant roles in moral development. In chapter 5, Leunissen examines the underlying ontology and physiology of moral habituation, arguing that Aristotle’s accounts in the NE and Physics VII.3, in particular, are more compatible with each other than they might first appear and together give us ‘a rich picture of what happens psychophysically when men who are born with good natural character traits and are raised in the right kind of city habituate themselves under the guidance of capable lawgivers and just laws.’ (115)

Building on David Charles’ recent ‘psychophysicalist’ interpretation of Aristotle’s psychology, Leunissen argues that moral habituation is an ‘inextricably psychophysical process’ (107). Moral virtue centrally involves emotion: to be virtuous is to be disposed to feel and act in certain ways. An emotion, Charles has argued, is an inextricably psychophysical state (or process) that is ‘inseparable in definition into two separate components’, a purely formal or psychological one and a purely physical one (Charles 2011, 83, quoted by Leunissen (108 n12); see also Charles 2008). Leunissen offers the following definition of anger as an example: ‘a boiling-of-the-blood-type-desire-for-revenge-after-pain-felt-at-a-supposed-slight’. (Leunissen notes (105 n15) that her definition draws not only on Charles’ work on De Anima, but also on Jamie Dow’s work on the Rhetoric in Dow 2011.) Since moral habituation centrally involves training our emotions, which are psychophysical states (or processes), moral habituation is a psychophysical process essentially involving both a psychological component and a physiological component. For example, acquiring patience or good temper (the virtues associated with anger) involves doing and feeling certain things and the relevant accompanying physiological processes, especially the heating and cooling of the blood. It follows that in addition to the usual advice about habituation — try to do and feel certain things — ‘those who do not have the kind of well-mixed blood that is best for moral development probably do well also to follow certain physical or dietary regimens that promote purity of blood’ (109).

Leunissen’s account is open to the following objection. Aside from approvingly citing and quoting Charles, she offers no independent argument for psychophysicalism — the view that the psychological and physiological aspects of an emotion’s essence cannot be distinguished one from the other. However, this is a theory about Aristotle’s psychology that is bound to strike many readers as controversial. Moreover, her account of moral habituation does not require it. All she requires is the weak thesis that the psychological and physiological aspects of each emotion, and thus of moral habituation, always and necessarily go together. She does not require the strong thesis that they are definitionally linked in the way that Charles has proposed. (To say that F is such that it always and necessarily involves G and H is not the same as saying that F is essentially G-H such that G’s and H’s contributions to F’s essence cannot be distinguished one from the other — in general and especially for Aristotle.) I do not mean to suggest that Charles’ proposal is wrong; it may very well be right. I only mean to suggest that Leunissen’s argument could have done without it — and given that it is novel and controversial and that Leunissen does not argue for it, she might have been better served by doing without it.

Finally, in Chapter 6, ‘The Natural Character and Moral Deficiencies of Women’, Leunissen argues that women (and natural slaves) are excluded from a life of happiness because they cannot achieve full moral virtue and practical wisdom on account of deficiencies in their material nature. Here, she enters an interesting debate over whether Aristotle’s ‘ethical views about the moral deficiencies of women are . . . causally linked to and explained by his biological views about the physiological imperfections of female relative to male members of the human species.’ (139) Leunissen argues that they are: women have the same formal nature as men but a different (in particular, colder) material nature, and as a result they are imperfect members of the human species. More specifically, although women can perform all human functions, they cannot perform some of these functions ‘well enough to ever reach moral excellence’ (152). Women’s colder material nature explains their two main flaws: their deliberative capacity is deficient and they are prone to weakness of will. Although women can reach their own proper virtue (in particular, the virtues of the assistant, e.g., silence), this is different from human virtue as such, which is available only to certain men. Women’s bodies, then, exclude them from full moral virtue and thus from a life of happiness.

Leunissen’s account of the moral deficiencies of women points to an interesting metaphysical question. Do women imperfectly realize the human species-form, or do they perfectly realize the species-form but have an imperfect ability to exercise some of the capacities constitutive of it? The question, in other words, is whether women are something less than fully human, or fully human but unable to live fully human lives. Leunissen opts for the second view: women possess fully all the capacities constitutive of the human species-form but they have a diminished ability to exercise some of them because of their material nature. So, for example, it’s not that women possess the capacity to reason to a lesser degree than men. It’s rather that they are less able than men to exercise that capacity. This may seem like a distinction without a difference, but she is right to think that it is not. For the question is whether Aristotle’s account of the moral and intellectual deficiencies of women is consistent with his overall metaphysical picture. On the first view, according to which women imperfectly realize the species-form, it seems doubtful that it is. On Leunissen’s view, according to which women are imperfectly able to exercise some of the capacities constitutive of the species-form because of their matter, it may well be. For her interpretation makes women very much like Aristotle’s famous drunk geometer, who fully possesses knowledge but is unable to exercise it because of a bodily impediment. It also leaves room for the (albeit very slim) possibility that the material obstacles impeding women from fully exercising certain capacities could be removed, just as the geometer can sober up.

Perhaps the most important achievement of Leunissen’s book is that it demonstrates the crucial role that luck plays in Aristotle’s theory of moral development. In NE I.10 Aristotle argues that although even great misfortune cannot deprive a virtuous person of his good character, it can deprive him of his happiness — for happiness requires not just virtue but also some measure of external goods, which are subject to luck. Priam does not become bad, but he does become unhappy. Leunissen argues convincingly that, although luck cannot deprive an agent of his virtue, it does play a significant role in determining whether he acquires it in the first place. She is aware that this claim is in prima facie tension with Aristotle’s view in NE III.5 that whether we become virtuous or vicious is ‘up to us’ and that we are responsible for our character. Her solution seems to be that this applies only to freeborn Greek men who have already received the proper upbringing and education (xvi-xvii, 135).

Leunissen says very little about NE III.5; I wish she had said more. However, assuming her solution is right, then, although as far as I can tell she never quite says this, her account suggests that members of morally unlucky groups — which is to say, most people — are not responsible for their character. (It is a separate question whether they are responsible for the actions they perform from character.) Now, Leunissen does not dwell on this, but it’s clear that she thinks, rightly of course, that Aristotle’s specific conclusions about women, ‘natural slaves’, and ‘barbarians’ are objectionable and wrong. However, once we have discarded these specific conclusions and the false scientific theories that, she argues, led Aristotle to them (let’s agree that it’s not all about blood), I’m left wondering whether, from a broad perspective, he isn’t right after all. Are there factors beyond an agent’s control that play a significant role in determining whether she achieves what her community considers to be a morally virtuous and flourishing life? Is becoming morally good significantly, maybe even largely, a matter of luck? For those who are disadvantaged from the start, should we be hesitant to hold them responsible for their character? If we think that the answer to these questions is ‘yes’, then it strikes me that the overall effect of Leunissen’s book is to make Aristotle’s moral theory seem more plausible, not less. More plausible, but less inspiring.

I highly recommend this fascinating book to anyone with interests in Aristotle’s ethics, politics, or biology, as well as anyone interested in the histories of gender and race.


Charles, D. 2008 "Aristotle's Psychological Theory" Proceedings of the Boston Area Colloquium of Ancient Philosophy 24:1-49.

Charles, D. 2011 "Desire in Action: Aristotle's Move" in M. Pakaluk and G. Pearson (eds.) Moral Psychology and Human Action in Aristotle. Oxford University Press, 75-93.

Dow, J. "Aristotle's Theory of the Emotions: Emotions as Pleasures and Pains" in M. Pakaluk and G. Pearson (eds.) Moral Psychology and Human Action in Aristotle. Oxford University Press, 47-74.


Thanks to Rachel Singpurwalla and Karen Stohr for helpful comments on an earlier draft of this review.