From Normativity to Responsibility

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Joseph Raz, From Normativity to Responsibility, Oxford University Press, 2011, 281pp., $55.00 (hbk), ISBN: 9780199693818.

Reviewed by David Owens, University of Reading


This is a monograph most of whose chapters are based on essays which have appeared in the last decade or so. Those essays have been revised to strengthen their argument, remove repetitions and highlight inter-connections. The book is divided into three parts. The four chapters of Part One concern the nature of normativity. The six chapters in Part Two consider various issues about practical reasoning. The final two chapters in Part Three discuss responsibility and its presuppositions. Raz has now published ten books over the last 40 years. It is something of a rarity for a philosopher's later writings to be of the same quality as the work that first established his name. Raz is one of those rare philosophers.

Raz has done as much as anyone else in the subject to make the notion of a reason the most serviceable tool of the practical philosopher. Moral psychologists, meta-ethicists, normative ethicists, political philosophers, philosophers of law, as well as philosophers of mind, epistemologists and many others formulate both their problematic and their theories by making claims about reasons. Past favourites like values, rules, principles, virtues, even the notion of 'ought', now play a subordinate role.

Such success can be dangerous; there is a risk of over-exposure. Perhaps talk of reasons acquired a mesmeric force from its early achievements that encouraged ever-wider application until it eventually lost its explanatory bite. Raz is alive to this danger. In Part One, he goes to great lengths to show that the notion of a reason has not been over-stretched and that it merits the foundational role it now occupies in discussion of a huge range of philosophical issues, indeed of everything that bears on the normative.

Here I shall concentrate on how Raz seeks to vindicate the theoretical ambitions of talk of reasons. Thus our focus will be on Part One of the book (together with one chapter from Part Two). My neglect of the rest should not be taken to imply any lack of interest in them. Chapter 8 'The Myth of Instrumental Rationality' has been very influential. The chapters on the significance of numbers in moral choice, on whether practical reasoning concludes with an intention, on moral luck and the nature of agent regret and the chapter on how our knowledge and ignorance affects what we ought to do are all powerful contributions.

The notion of a reason appears in different forms of explanation and Raz begins by noting the difference between explanations invoking normative reasons and those invoking (purely) explanatory reasons (16-20). In a statement like 'the reason why he waved was to attract her attention' the reason is normative. In a statement like 'the humidity was the reason for his collapse' the reason is (purely) explanatory. Raz maintains that normative reasons must be capable of playing a certain explanatory role in our psychology and that it is by understanding this distinctive role that we grasp what is special about a normative reason:

My promise explains my promise-keeping action in the right way when awareness of the fact that I promised includes recognition of it as a reason for the action, and I take the action to be sensible because it is supported, perhaps even required, by my promise. The low pressure affects me independently of whether I am aware of it, and regardless of what I think of it. (28)

Here a normative reason for keeping my promise serves as my reason for keeping the promise. Raz notes the great variety of states and events for which one can have reasons (from now on I shall take 'normative' to be understood) and he maintains that all of these items have this in common: they are the kind of thing that can be explained by their subject's apprehension of something he or she thinks of as a reason for them. And when they are so explained, one has them for this reason. I'll call this form of explanation by reasons guidance by reason.

Among the phenomena governed by normative reasons, the items that receive the bulk of Raz's attention are actions, intentions and beliefs. There is also some discussion of the emotions, though Raz concedes that he does no more than 'introduce the topic, which is too large to be dealt with here' (48). It is a striking feature of contemporary moral psychology that the rationality of the emotions is regarded as a peripheral case, one whose treatment can be postponed until after the more central cases have been dealt with. Raz does more than most to engage with issues raised by the emotions but a treatment of rationality that started with the emotions might end up in a rather different place.

From here on I'll be discussing Raz's view that the factors that make sense of our beliefs are our reasons for those beliefs in so far as they explain our beliefs by guiding their formation. Raz begins his discussion of reasons for belief as follows:

A first clarification concerns the question what determines whether available epistemic reasons are sufficient to warrant belief. It is not my view that only truth-related considerations figure among those determining the sufficiency of the case. However, the factors or principles that determine whether the case for the truth of a proposition is adequate to warrant belief are not themselves reasons for belief. (37)

Raz carefully distinguishes believing a proposition from merely accepting it (i.e. being prepared to act as if it is true). He might be prepared to allow that the non-truth related considerations relevant to acceptance are also reasons for acceptance but he is unwilling to say so in the case of belief. On the face of it, this looks like an unmotivated stipulation. To make up your mind about whether p involves not merely weighing the evidence for and against p. It also involves determining whether (should the evidence favour p) the weight of evidence in p's favour is sufficient to justify belief in p, rather than continued agnosticism on the point. Why shouldn't the considerations relevant to this determination be called reasons?

There are various possibilities here. It might be the importance of being right about whether p that determines how much evidence you must have in p's favour before you are entitled to believe that p; it might be facts about the general function of belief in human life (rather than features of this particular belief) that determine how much evidence suffices. Perhaps sufficiency is often a vague matter or a matter that leaves room for different and equally reasonable views. In any case, if belief can ever be rational there will be facts that explain why certain levels of evidence suffice to justify belief and certain others do not. For the sake of a name, call them 'pragmatic factors'. Why shouldn't these pragmatic factors serve as reasons for belief, as epistemic reasons, at least in the mind of a creature capable of recognising them as such?

When assessing the beliefs of others (or our own beliefs in prospect or in retrospect) we do allude to pragmatic factors: 'given the significance of issue, we should have kept an open mind about whether the Vietnamese attacked our destroyers until we heard more', 'even his brother should have believed he was a crook given the evidence against him', 'of course you're entitled to ignore the possibility that the barn is a mere façade, otherwise you wouldn't believe anything at all' and so forth. Believers can and do recognise pragmatic factors and recognise them as relevant to the justification of belief. Raz joins them in this. So why does he refuse pragmatic factors the title of 'reasons for belief'?

According to Raz, what makes reasons for belief creatures of the same species as reasons for action (and so forth) is that the reasons on which that belief is based explain our belief in p in a certain way, namely as the product of our recognition of these reasons as reasons for this belief. Reasons for belief are considerations that guide belief. But it looks doubtful that rational believers do in fact get themselves to believe that p by reflecting on the importance of being right about p, let alone on aspects of the general function of belief in human life. Though pragmatic factors bear on our assessment of a given belief 'from the outside' they don't seem to play a role in the theoretical deliberations of a rational believer, they don't seem to guide belief.

That, I suspect, is why Raz refuses such pragmatic factors the title of 'reasons' for belief. If I'm right, Raz's stipulation is strongly motivated but perhaps not quite so well supported. Rather than go along with it, we might just as easily conclude that, since pragmatic factors explain the beliefs for which they are reasons other than by guiding the formation of those beliefs, the notion of guidance cannot be used to say what these 'reasons' have in common with other 'reasons'. Reflection on another strand of Raz's discussion of belief, namely the No Gap Principle, encourages this suspicion.

Raz formulates the No Gap Principle as follows:

Weak No Gap: 'there is no gap, no extra step in reasoning between believing that the case for the truth of the proposition is conclusive and believing the proposition' (38)

Strong No Gap: 'one comes to believe that p upon realising that there is conclusive evidence for it' (39)

(See also pp. 92-3). These statements are equivalent if 'no gap' in Weak No Gap means 'no gap of any kind' but the addition of 'no extra step in reasoning' suggests that 'no gap' might instead mean 'no gap in reasoning'. We should make the latter reading available to Raz, producing a weaker and a stronger version of No Gap.

Three clarifications. Firstly, both of these claims are intended to enunciate conceptual truths about belief (136). Secondly, both are meant to hold only when the subject is directly acquainted with the content of the belief in question (and isn't just being told (say) that a certain news item, content unspecified, is well founded). Thirdly, I take it that by 'conclusive evidence for p' Raz means 'evidence sufficient to permit or else to require one who considers the matter to believe in p'.

Let's agree for the moment that the move from the belief that the evidence for p is sufficient to establish that p to belief in p is a move that requires 'no further step in reasoning' (Weak No Gap). I would argue that the move still needs to be made, for one could (however irrationally) hold that the evidence for p suffices to establish its truth whilst failing to actually believe it. In Raz's eyes, that is how it is with intention (131-7). Though no step in reasoning is required to move from believing that I ought to A to intending to A, I can perfectly well fail to form the intentions that I believe I ought to form. Why should it be any different with belief?

At this point it would be good to know more about Raz's conception of belief. What Raz does say makes one wonder why he endorses Strong No Gap so confidently:

Attribution of belief depends on the existence of a variety of criteria of belief and they include not only avowing the belief, and attesting to reasons for it etc. but also responding to it appropriately: those who would not put an apple on the table . . . for fear that the apple may fall to the floor show themselves not to believe there is a table there. (93)

Belief sounds like a complex multi-track disposition bearing on one's behaviour just as much as on one's cognition. Indeed belief sounds rather like intention. And if the mere judgement that one ought to intend won't ensure that one does intend, why should we expect things to be any different with belief? Why can't I think I ought to believe that all university degrees are of equal value, telling everyone that the evidence has shown this to be so, whilst remaining convinced that some universities have higher standards than others? My snobbery gets the better of me and I believe what I think I ought not to believe. This is too prosaic to be dismissed as a 'pathological' case (92).

Raz might reply that there are clear differences between intention and belief. When I feel  tempted to omit something I ought to do or else do something foolish or forbidden 'what is required is the marshalling of one's will' (136). Surely there is no analog of this in the case of belief? I don't summon the strength either to believe or disbelieve something in the light of the evidence for it; either I'm convinced or I'm not. That seems right but it hardly establishes the truth of Strong No Gap. When discussing the emotions, Raz remarks that 'emotions do not necessarily respond to reasons with the immediacy that characterises belief's relationship to reasons' (48). It is a familiar experience both to fail to be angry when you think anger justified and to be angry when you think you ought not. But the undeniable gap between our emotions and our assessment of them is not to be filled by a simple act of will -- either the situation angers you or it doesn't. Here (as elsewhere) belief behaves rather like an emotion. Even if Raz is right that what is required to impose normative discipline on belief and emotion is not a further step in reasoning (Weak No Gap), he is wrong to identify our beliefs with our assessments of the evidence for them (Strong No Gap).

So why does Raz move from the Weak and to the Strong version of his No Gap Principle? Let's return to the issue of guidance by reasons. Suppose Strong No Gap were true. Then, at least in a believer with the relevant concepts, the belief in p and the belief that one ought to believe that p would not be psychologically distinct states. To arrive at one conclusion would just be to arrive at the other. In particular one would not become convinced of p by first arriving at a belief that the evidence one has in p's favour is sufficient to justify belief in p (136). Rather one would move straight from the evidence for p to the belief it supports. And that would explain why the pragmatic factors, those that settle whether the available evidence is sufficient to justify belief in p, play no role in guiding the formation of that belief. They would do so only if we had first to establish an intermediate conclusion about the sufficiency of our evidence.

Were Strong No Gap true, Raz would have explained the puzzling status possessed by pragmatic factors on his view of reasons for belief; Raz would have explained how it can be that pragmatic factors are both relevant to the justification of belief and yet fail to guide it (and so fail to count as reasons for belief in his view). Since Strong No Gap isn't plausible, we must look elsewhere for a vindication of the claim implicit in Weak No Gap that the transition from our assessment of the evidence for p to first-order belief in p is 'not a step in reasoning'. And we must do so without assuming that 'step in reasoning' just means 'step involving guidance by reasons'. (Raz does provide further arguments for the Weak No Gap as applied to intention but he acknowledges that these further considerations do not hold of belief (132-5)).

To sum up, pragmatic factors seem not to guide the formation of belief. Nevertheless they serve as reasons for belief in much the same sense that evidence serves as a reason for belief. They explain belief in a distinctive (i.e. not purely causal) way. Guidance by reasons may be ubiquitous in the practical realm but its role in the theoretical realm is much less evident. And that raises the question with which we began: what do reasons for belief (and emotion) have in common with reasons for intention and action? What is the point of calling them both (normative) reasons?