From Personality to Virtue: Essays on the Philosophy of Character

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Alberto Masala and Jonathan Webber (eds.), From Personality to Virtue: Essays on the Philosophy of Character, Oxford University Press, 2016, 262pp., $74.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780198746812.

Reviewed by Edward Skidelsky, University of Exeter


The last decade has seen a revival of enthusiasm for the old Victorian idea that the problems of the poor are essentially moral, not material in nature. The result has been a slew of schemes for "character education", including the UK government's Character Innovation Fund and the Templeton Foundation's Character Development project. Some see this as a well-meaning attempt to alleviate the plight of the needy, others as a cynical ploy to distract attention from weightier problems of inequality and lack of opportunity. Either way, it has given the academic sub-discipline of virtue ethics an unexpected lease of relevance.

If character is to be cultivated, it must of course exist. But does it? "Situationist" critics of virtue ethics have seized on experiments showing that small and apparently insignificant features of the environment -- a dropped coin, a pending appointment -- can predict an agent's behaviour better than his or her alleged traits. Character, they have concluded, is a myth. But that's a non sequitur, as virtue ethicists have been quick to point out: a weak character is not no character at all. Still, the situationist findings might make us want to rethink Aristotle's remark about all virtuous action stemming from a "firm and unchanging disposition" -- unless we are content to admit that none of us are virtuous.

The essays in this collection grow out of these debates. Their general goal is to show that Aristotelian moral philosophy is not wedded to an antiquated "armchair" psychology -- that it can (at a stretch) accommodate the latest experimental findings. In the words of its editors, the volume aims to "consolidate and extend the growing rapprochement between philosophers and psychologists working on the nature and evaluation of human motivation". That sounds like a worthy undertaking. My only concern is that the quest for political relevance and "empirical adequacy" may lead Aristotelians to jettison much that is distinctive and valuable in their approach.

Any form of virtue ethics must ask itself why exactly virtue is good. Is it because it tends to promote good states of affairs, or because it is good intrinsically? The latter was the view of Aristotle and all other ancient philosophers, with the possible exception of Epicurus. But the recent policy literature on character development is overwhelmingly utilitarian in spirit. Virtue is promoted as a means to social and political ends, as part of what economists dismayingly call "human capital". But of course, if those same ends turn out to be reachable by cheaper, more reliable means, virtue is superfluous. The history of chastity offers a suggestive parallel. Presented as it commonly was in early twentieth-century moral propaganda as a recipe for preventing unwanted pregnancies, it could not but lose its raison d'être in the era of reliable contraception and legal abortion. Is this the fate of virtue more generally?

It's a shame that these essays aren't more explicit on this question of the value of virtue, for it lies tantalisingly in the background of many of them. Katrina L. Sifferd condemns "chemical castration" for sex offenders (licensed in a number of jurisdictions) on the grounds that its recipients "will never have the opportunity to redirect their sexual desires to legal, consenting targets, or learn to express their sexuality in the right way, at the right time". But why is that a problem? If recidivism is the concern, one might always insist on treatment for life, or a return to old-fashioned physical castration. I am sure this is not what Sifferd would want. But unless she can defend sexual continence as intrinsically -- as opposed to merely instrumentally -- valuable, she has no very convincing come-back to such proposals.

The essays by Jules Holroyd and Daniel Kelly and by Jonathan Webber, tackle the much discussed issue of implicit bias -- that is, bias revealed in automatic associations and gestures, often in despite of subjects' declared attitudes. These three agree that implicit bias can be controlled, but they leave us wondering why such control is desirable. It cannot just be to avoid, say, unfair appointments, for that might be achieved more easily and reliably by institutional measures: interviewing candidates behind a screen, introducing quotas for minorities, and so forth. If such measures are inadequate, it must be because the bias in question is bad in itself and not just because of its consequences.

Another potential victim of the "growing rapprochement" between virtue ethics and empirical psychology is the inner life. The danger here stems less from any principled commitment to behaviourism -- a now largely discredited doctrine -- than from the practical constraints of the experimental method. It is hard to test for complex emotions and perceptions in the laboratory, meaning that character traits tend de facto to be identified with their behavioural manifestations. A central feature of the influential CAPS model of personality, writes Christian B. Miller in his essay, is "the claim that each individual's personality can be represented by various 'if-then situation-behaviour contingencies'". In other words, "Tommy is irascible" means, roughly, "if Tommy were provoked, Tommy would probably yell and stamp".

No philosopher faithful to Aristotle could accept this as an account of irascibility, or of any other complex trait. For Aristotelians, virtues and vices are primarily dispositions of feeling, only secondarily of action. And Platonists like Iris Murdoch place even more emphasis on the role of the imagination in enlarging or distorting our moral sympathies. It is disappointing, then, to find several contributors describing the process of ethical formation from a largely external standpoint, as a matter of "props" and "manipulations". Holroyd and Kelly suggest that "a person might rein in the expression of her own implicit racial biases by putting up pictures of admired black celebrities around her office", while Nafsika Athanassoulis urges educators to "ensure that students are exposed to the [manipulations] which encourage the best behaviour." They might be talking about the training of circus animals.

Of course, mantras and icons have their role in ethical development, as religious believers have always known, but only as a prop to the all-important inner transformation. To treat such things as independently efficacious is to engage in a kind of manipulation, which isn't made any better by the fact that its object is oneself. Webber is on sounder ground when he argues that the best way to counter implicit bias is not negatively, with situational nudges (such as putting up pictures of Obama around the office), but positively, by instilling in oneself the virtue of fairness. Frustratingly, he doesn't indicate how this might work. One hopes it would be by familiarising oneself with the great narratives of mutual recognition and not just by chanting "all humans are equal" ten times a day before breakfast.

There are other good things here. Alberto Masala is surely right to argue that virtue is not a specific "competence", like driving a car, but an infinitely extendable "mastery". There is no threshold of sufficiency when it comes to kindness or courage; if there were, the supreme exemplars of kindness and courage could have nothing to teach us. (Julia Annas has argued essentially the same point, though the use she makes of it is rather different.)

Perhaps the most suggestive essay is Mark Alfano's "Friendship and the Structure of Trust", in which he argues that trustworthiness (and possibly other virtues too) may depend essentially on the existence of certain attitudes in others. For instance, I am moved to become trustworthy because my friends and acquaintances trust me and I want to prove myself worthy of their good opinion. (Alfano adds the subtle point, borrowed from Victoria McGeer, that to work its good effects this trust must be vested in me in a spirit of hope and not just as a flattering play on my self-regard.) I don't think that Alfano succeeds in establishing his central claim that one person's trustworthiness "depends not just causally but constitutively" on others' trust. It must be possible to be trustworthy even in the absence of trust; indeed, this might be regarded as the highest form of trustworthiness. Still, it may well be true, as a matter of psychological fact, that no individual would be moved to develop the virtue of trustworthiness if others did not bestow on him an initial, hopeful trust. Alfano's essay points to the deep role of motives of honour and shame in moral education -- a point that was not lost on the ancients but is largely overlooked in modern discussions.