From Plato to Platonism

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Lloyd P. Gerson, From Plato to Platonism, Cornell University Press, 2013, 345pp., $59.95 (hbk), ISBN 9780801452413.

Reviewed by Svetla Slaveva-Griffin, Florida State University


This book is extra-ordinary, in the etymological sense of the predicate, not so much on account of the ingenuity of its argument, which is a given when Lloyd Gerson is the author, but on account of where it stands and what it represents in Gerson’s unabated interest in getting to the bottom of the most influential philosophical school in antiquity. The book also bridges the study of Platonism across the self-imposed divide between North American and continental scholarship. Exactly three decades ago, Gerson started his promethean publication track with Aristotle: Selected Works (1983), shortly followed by Aristotle’s Politics (1986). Ever since then he has travelled, as so many others, the alluring road of getting from Aristotle to Plato. Unlike many others, however, he has not only arrived at Plato, as with his Knowing Persons: A Study in Plato (2003), but also surpassed his goal by revisiting his starting point with his Aristotle and Other Platonists (2005). From Plato to Platonism is the most recent installment in this trajectory.

Gerson’s return to Aristotle, in his 2005 monograph and in the book under this review, shows a logical and not circular progression. There is an explicit conceptual systematicity in his successive re-examination of old thorny issues, from the nature of Aristotle’s attitude towards Plato and his philosophy to the grounding presence of Plotinus in the history of late ancient philosophy. From Plato to Platonism does not re-evaluate contested topics such as the “agreement between Plato and Aristotle” (cf. his Aristotle and Other Platonists) or the vitality of ‘Neoplatonism’ as a label suitable to identify the work of the philosophers who perceived themselves as nothing but Platonists in late antiquity (cf. The Cambridge History of Philosophy in Late Antiquity, 2010, vol. 1, p. 3). Gerson has already done this. The next step in his enterprise of elucidating all corners of Platonism, at display in his latest book, is introspective. Centripetal, to be precise, in a very Platonic fashion. He shifts his attention from the relatively localized issues, mentioned above, to the summa quaestionis of what Platonism is and even further to whether Plato himself was a Platonist. His answer to both questions is that Plato was indeed a Platonist and Platonism as a whole is an umbrella term, encompassing many versions of Platonism, all of which, including Plato’s own, originate from and depend on what Gerson hypothetically construes as a matrix of all Platonism(s), which he dubs “Ur-Platonism” (hereafter UP). Both of his answers are daring and against the status quo, especially in the westernmost quarters of the scholarship. His latest book offers a tour de force argument that will certainly stir up some weaves in its reception. But this is a good thing.

The “purity” of Plato’s thought has had many defenders against its dilution by the literary form of his dialogues, the apocryphal nature of his “unwritten doctrines,” and the allegiance of those who identified themselves as his followers in antiquity. In this vein, the name ‘Platonist’ acquired the technical meaning ‘not to be like Plato but to be different from Plato’. This interpretation leads to the far-fetched conclusion that Platonism, in its core, is a secondary philosophical development that, in as far as it is based on Plato’s doctrines and presented in his dialogues, is not only derivative of them but also carries the danger of distorting them. While distilling the philosophical essence of Plato’s views either internally from any literary sedimentation, grafted by the dialogue structure of the works, or externally from the subsequent diverse explication of his thought by generations of self-proclaimed Platonists, this line of interpretation places Plato and his thought in a vacuum, against the ample evidence pointing to the contrary. According to this, Plato was not a Platonist but a sui generis fons Platonicorum.

The above may be also interpreted as a rescue operation to save Plato from the impetuousness of his followers who, regardless of their philosophic differences, avidly saw their work as a continuation of Plato’s. Aside from its ahistorical nature, the operation also raises the obvious question, if Plato is not a Platonist, then, what he is? Gerson rejects this view and calls for a balanced analytical and historical approach according to which “Plato was a stellar Platonist” (p. 6).

Gerson builds his argument on the two most common meanings of the term ‘Platonism’: the first refers to “whatever is found in Plato’s dialogues” (p. 3) with the qualification that, in this sense, ‘Platonism’ does not denote Plato’s philosophical position(s) but only what Plato reveals of his views through his literary characters in the dialogues; the second refers to “a consistent or at least comprehensive philosophical position, maintained by followers of Plato” (p. 4). These two usages of ‘Platonism’ underlay the tri-partite structure of Gerson’s book. Part 1 examines the content of ‘Platonism’, as found in Plato’s dialogues, in four main subsections: “Was Plato a Platonist?;” “Socrates and Platonism;” “Reading the Dialogues Platonically;” “Aristotle on Plato and Platonism.” Part 2 moves to the second meaning of ‘Platonism’, referring to the versions of Platonism propounded by Plato’s immediate or not-so-distant followers: Speusippus, Xenocrates, the Academic Skeptics, Antiochus of Ascalon, Plutarch of Chaeronea, Alcinous, and Numenius. Part 3 looks at the more distant but most influential reincarnation of Platonism as found in the systematic philosophy of Plotinus. For reasons of concision and space, I will expand below on the chapters that are constitutional for Gerson’s argument.

Part 1 is entitled “Plato and His Readers” and tackles headfirst the problem with the currently prevalent understanding of the relation between Plato and Platonism. The opening chapter addresses the vexed question of whether Plato was a Platonist. The crux of Gerson’s answer to the question — and the crux of the entire book — is that, if we are after a historically accurate and philosophically accountable understanding of Plato, his philosophy and its reception, we have to answer the above question affirmatively. According to Gerson, the negative answer, which has been influentially given in the scholarly circles, shaped by E. R. Dodds’ article “The Parmenides of Plato and the Origin of the Neoplatonic ‘One’” (1928), Ryle’s Plato’s Progress (1966), or Gadamer’s Gesammelte Werke (1985), does not cut it. It does not, first and foremost, because the negative answer takes under consideration only Plato’s views presented in the dialogues. This leads to internal and external problems. Internally, it faces the challenge of sorting out and explicating which views in the dialogues are Plato’s own, which belong to his literary characters, and how we can distinguish between the two. Also, it requires an absolute isolation of each view, which, in turn, endangers the very understanding of what we call ’Plato’s philosophy’ from a developmental and a unitarian perspective. Gerson cautions that what we call ’Plato’s philosophy’ is not “‘the sum’ of what we find in the dialogues” but that the dialogues “are the best evidence we have for Plato’s philosophy” (p. 6). He judiciously distinguishes between Plato’s dialogues and Plato’s philosophy, without minimizing the import of the dialogues for the latter. But the greater impact of his position concerns the relation between Plato’s philosophy and Platonism. The influential (at least among the English-speaking circles) view that Plato’s philosophy is not Platonism also entails the negative view that Plato was not a Platonist. Gerson’s positive counterargument that Plato was a Platonist correctively advocates the understanding that Plato’s philosophy is a version of Platonism (pp. 6-8).

If Plato’s philosophy is a version of Platonism, what Platonism is it a version of? And where can we find it? Since Platonism is not limited to Plato’s views as found in his dialogues, nor to other philosophers’ presentation of them (primarily Aristotle’s), nor to later philosophers’ contribution to what is found in Plato’s works, Platonism as a term must be flexible enough to signify the above three aspects severally and collectively. To distinguish this all-inclusive meaning of Platonism from each of the individual renditions above, Gerson hypothetically construes the term Ur-Platonism as a matrix-like collection of all possible meanings of Platonism. In his words, UP “is the general philosophical position that arises from the conjunction of the negations of the philosophical positions explicitly rejected in the dialogues” (p. 9). These positions are anti-materialism, anti-mechanism, anti-nominalism, anti-relativism, and anti-skepticism. Holistically considered, the five pillars of UP give a positive outlook for what there is and build the foundation of Platonic metaphysics. The usefulness of Gerson’s hypothetical construction is immediately apparent. If accepted, Plato’s philosophy and the philosophy of all generations of self-identified Platonists after him present different versions of UP. Each version draws from the same five pillars of UP to a different degree and with a varying, if not sometimes, different result. The variations between them give rise to their distinctive character and are the object of Gerson’s individual treatments in Parts 2 and 3.

The hypothetical construct of UP is a big pill to swallow even for those who less skeptically received Gerson’s previous audacious argument that Aristotle is “au fond a Platonist” (Gerson 2005, p. 290). Gerson is disarmingly candid about the possible criticisms of his current thesis, some of which he admits are what they are, insurmountable: that his proposition is ahistorical and anachronistic (p. 10); that it is impossible to prove that the Platonists and particularly Plato “actually embraced these elements of UP” (p. 14); that there is an unlimited number of possible combinations of the five ‘antis’ above (pp. 16-17); or why it is better to found the understanding of Plato’s philosophy on a hypothetical matrix such as UP and not on the dialogues (pp. 18-19). The bottom line of Gerson’s defense of his thesis, aside from his analytical precision, is his demonstration “of how much of the actual form and content of the dialogues makes sense when we see them as built on a conjunction of the above five ‘antis’” (p. 14). This defense is no less valid for the other prime objects of his examination: the subsequent versions of Platonism from its interpretation in Aristotle to its systematization in Plotinus. Weighing the cons and pros of his thesis, it is fair to conclude that its direct benefits offset its obstacles. For constraints of space, I will focus on the overarching impact of his suggested model. Otherwise, about his individual treatments, and especially that of Plotinus, I will say that it is robust and presents an appealing history of Platonism. Gerson’s assertion that “one of the principal justifications for maintaining UP is that there is something like a correct or defensible systemic first philosophy” (p. 143) leaves the door wide open for relating all subsequent versions of Platonism, with their exacting metaphysical and epistemological hierarchy, to UP.

Gerson is careful not to explain the relation between UP and its dependent Platonisms in terms of subordination or the Platonic original-and-copy model. Instead, he conceives of this relation in terms of coordination or, better yet, in terms of Wittgenstein’s popular notion of ‘family resemblance’. The five ‘antis’ that construct his UP are the DNA underlying every version of Platonism, however differently expressed. The benefit of grouping these constitutive principles under the putative umbrella of UP is to gain a measuring stick to determine whether a given philosophy is a version of Platonism or not. The principles themselves did not essentially change over time. What changes is the texture of their internal ordination.

The greatest benefit of Gerson’s proposition is that it provides a conceptual framework in which Plato’s philosophy finally fits. Not many would be willing to give up the exclusive statutory position of Plato’s philosophy in relation to its later permutations and to think of it as “a version of Platonism.” Gerson’s thesis offers an elegant solution to the problem. As soon as we consider Plato’s philosophy as a version of Platonism, its purity is preserved because the subsequent versions of Platonism do not originate from it but from the UP. In fact, the same can be said for all versions of Platonism since they are drawing not from each other but from the UP. Gerson’s model has the flexibility to include them all, without washing off their individual character.

The concept of UP provides for Plato’s philosophy and Platonism what the principle of unity in diversity provides for most ancient philosophical schools, but this is a loose end which Gerson leaves untied. In order for the model of the matrix UP and the versions of Platonism to work, one needs to explain either 1) how this model is unique and works exclusively within Platonism or 2) how this model applies to the other ancient philosophical schools. For example, Stoicism is a fitting candidate for this kind of model, especially if one deems the Stoics to be closet Platonists, as it has been already proposed independently of Gerson. Gerson offers the beginning of this conversation in his discussion of Antiochus of Ascalon in ch. 7.

Another issue that requires more central attention than the one given in the book is the exact nature of the relation between the UP and the intermediary versions of Platonism in the making of a particular version. If we go back to our analogy of the UP as the DNA of Platonism, then the need to account for the interaction of these intermediary changes with the UP DNA in a given Platonic phenotype becomes notable, as in Gerson’s presentation of Plotinus’ version of Platonism in Part 3.

The above observations are trifles in comparison with the meritorious achievement of the book. There is a lot of meat in what From Plato to Platonism has to offer. This is the kind of book that anyone who works on Platonism will have to reckon with. The finesse of Gerson’s analysis and the wealth of knowledge he imparts will be overwhelming for a reader with a budding exposure to Platonic scholarship, but for the veteran reader in all matters Platonic, it will be a treat.