From Plural to Institutional Agency: Collective Action II

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Kirk Ludwig, From Plural to Institutional Agency: Collective Action II, Oxford University Press, 2017, 312pp., $70.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780198789994.

Reviewed by Michael E. Bratman, Stanford University


Kirk Ludwig's concern in this trenchant, probing, and important book is to articulate continuities between "plural agency" (e.g., you and I paint the house together) and what we talk about when we talk about[1] the agency of "singular groups" -- where these include both mobs and (the primary concern of this book) institutions such as corporations or nation states. In the background is Ludwig's first volume in this two-volume work: From Individual to Plural Agency (Oxford University Press, 2016). In that first volume Ludwig understands intentional plural agency as involving a single event (e.g., our house painting) of which several individuals (e.g., each of us) are intentional agents with relevant "we-intentions". Such we-intentions are ordinary intentions with a content that favors, e.g., our painting by way of a shared plan.

As Ludwig notes, his model of plural agency is in some respects similar to -- but in other respects different from -- the reductive model I myself have tried to develop.[2] But whereas I have focused on characteristic functional roles of individual and shared intention, Ludwig's approach is framed by a concern with relevant action sentences. In particular, he offers analyses of plural action sentences that extend Davidson-inspired analyses of individual-action sentences.[3] In each case, there is quantification over relevant events, and the actions are those events. In the case of plural action sentences there is a single event with multiple agents.

This current volume aims both to "project the multiple agents account of the logical form of plural action sentences to singular group action sentences" (258) and to articulate "the intentional structures that underlie" (274) what we talk about when we talk about the agency of institutions. A key idea is that in a case of an institution the relevant multiple agents are members of the group, where such membership involves a socially-constructed, time-indexed membership relation that is specified by rules that are "collectively accepted" within a relevant population. (There is a different membership relation for mobs.) For a rule to be collectively accepted within a population is for "enough" of those in that population to have associated (conditional) we-intentions. Rules of membership are constitutive rules in the sense that intentionally following them constitutes the activity they concern. Further, membership is a "status role" in the sense that it involves the acceptance of these rules by those who are members. Such membership is "the fundamental institutional role." (6)

So, our talk of institutional agency is talk about the agency of members of the group (where this involves appeal to the socially-constructed membership relation). In Ludwig's example: to say that the Supreme Court ruled in 1896 that segregation is constitutional is to say that there is an event, E, such that in 1896 each member of the Supreme Court in 1896 (and only those individuals) was an agent of E, and E "was a ruling to the effect that segregation is constitutional". (260) And to be a member of the Supreme Court in 1896 is to satisfy and accept the conditions of membership specified by relevant collectively accepted rules.

Not all those whose collective acceptance of relevant rules induces the relevant membership relation will themselves be members. After all, not all those whose collective acceptance induces the conditions for membership on the Supreme Court are themselves members of that court. However, given that membership is a status role, all members will accept the relevant rules.

Collectively accepted constitutive rules specify certain institutional roles -- e.g., being a manager with certain responsibilities. Such rules can also specify ways in which the institutional group can authorize a "proxy agent" whose relevant action counts as the "culmination" of the actions of the members of the group. For example, in the case of a spokesperson "the group's authorization of the spokesperson . . . is essential to what they [the members of the group] do through the instrument of the spokesperson." (267) When, for example, the group announces a policy through a spokesperson, the agents of the involved announcement-event are the members of the group.[4] If the spokesperson is not a member of the group then she will not be among the agents of the group's announcement event. This seems an odd result.

A related issue concerning whether the relevant agents include non-members is raised by Ludwig's proposal that the relevant form of membership in a corporation is ownership of shares. (I take it that this is an empirical conjecture about the contents of the collective acceptances that help constitute our institution of a corporation.) On the theory, then, what we talk about when we talk about the agency of a corporation is the agency of the shareowners. We are not directly talking about the agency of managers who are not shareowners. Again, this seems an odd result.

In 2010 John Searle proposed, roughly, that the collective acceptance that is central to institutions need only involve mutual belief that certain things or persons play certain roles in the actual social functioning.[5] In contrast, Ludwig argues that the relevant kind of collective acceptance needs to involve intention in favor of the relevant social pattern. Ludwig's thought here that in collective acceptance "we adopt the description of the pattern as a guide to bringing it about" (98) echoes H.L.A. Hart's idea that "if a social rule is to exist some at least must look upon the behavior in question as a general standard to be followed by the group as a whole."[6] But a problem is that many participants in a large-scale institution will not have we-intentions in favor of relevant functioning. As Scott Shapiro has emphasized, there can be officials who only intend (as is said, I-intend) to do what counts as their part so as to get paid.[7] And (as Hart would agree) there can be citizens of the state who, while they have I-intentions to conform to the laws, given relevant sanctions, do not have we-intentions in favor of the functioning of the state. Given that membership is a status role, such "alienated" officials or citizens are not members of the state. So, in particular, when we talk about the actions of the state we are not directly talking about the agency of such alienated officials. This seems an odd result.

Ludwig notes that in many states there is a role of citizenship induced by collectively accepted rules that do not require that a citizen herself accept those rules. Citizenship can involve a "hybrid membership role" (272): for some it will be a status role; for some it will not. And Ludwig has subtle things to say about how to reconcile this complexity with his "underlying picture of state agency." (273)

But the harder issue concerns alienated officials. Shapiro's alienated judge only I-intends to do her job so as to get paid. An implication of Ludwig's view of membership as a status role is that Shapiro's judge is not a member of the state, where (on Ludwig's view) talk of state action is talk about the action of its members.

Ludwig is skeptical that there are such cases: "people who work in or are in elected position in the government have accepted their roles." (246) This seems plausible if accepting a role is (as Searle suggests) roughly a matter of recognizing how it works within the institution. But what Ludwig needs is acceptance of a role that involves we-intentions that favor that institutional functioning. And it seems that Shapiro is right that there can well be alienated officials without such we-intentions.

So there seem to be inter-related problems in the account of membership and in the restriction of the agency of which we talk, in talking about an institution's agency, to members of that institution. Perhaps we can address some of these problems by re-thinking the ideas of collective acceptance of a rule and a status role. Suppose you intentionally conform to a rule on the basis of an I-intention rather than a relevant we-intention. Nevertheless, you may do so because of a social structure that involves others who, as you know, do have relevant we-intentions. Perhaps those others have set up a system of incentives, or of legitimate authority, to which you are responding as those others expect and intend. This suggests an approach in the space between Searle's and Ludwig's: roughly, collective acceptance of R (and a Hartian social rule) involves a public web of interlocking we-intentions and I-intentions of the various participants, where those I-intentions are appropriately explained by reasons induced by those we-intentions. We can then say that membership is a status role in the sense that a member participates in the collective acceptance of relevant rules; but that participation can involve I-intentions that are suitably explained by reasons induced by relevant we-intentions of others. So alienated officials may be members of the state.

Are there institutional agents? Well, applying his reductive account of singular-group action sentences to our talk of corporations, Ludwig infers that "nowhere will we find, and nowhere do we need . . . to invoke the agency of anything other than the individuals who occupy the various roles that constitute the organizational structure of the corporation." (271) In general, from the point of view -- which is Ludwig's -- of what is needed to explain commonsense talk about agency,[8] we can be eliminative about institutional agents: there are no such agents.[9]

There is, however, an alternative perspective: we can see the reduction of institutional agency as constructive, rather than as eliminative. Think about individual intentional agency. A common, causal theory sees intentional action as consisting in certain kinds of causal-psychological-rational processes. In specifying such processes, the theory aims to say, as David Velleman puts it, what happens when someone acts.[10] Such theories aim not to eliminate intentional agency, but to provide a reductive construction: there is individual intentional agency, and this is, in certain basic cases, that in which it consists. Could we use the philosophical resources Ludwig has provided as part of a constructive reduction of institutional agency? Could we say that there really are activities whose agents are institutions, and the functioning of the cited complex intentional structures is, in certain basic cases, that in which such agency consists? To echo Velleman: this is what each thinks and does, both individually and together, when an institution acts. This constructive interpretation does not seem precluded simply by the claim that in the account of institutional action sentences there is no singular term referring to the institutional agent.

However, though Ludwig sees his analogous reduction of individual intentional agency as constructive (volume 1, 80, note 17), his dominant thought is that his reduction of institutional agency is eliminative. His primary (though, not only) reason for this goes beyond his focus on the logical form of relevant sentences and appeals to a second Davidsonian idea: there is agency only if there is intentional agency, and there is intentional agency only if there is a holistic web of attitudes that play an appropriate explanatory role.[11] But "the usual holistic constraints on attitude attribution are absent in the case of attributions to organizations." (238) The web of attitudes plausibly attributed to an institution will normally be thin and partial: "the mind of the committee . . . can really be quite empty except for a handful of thoughts." (238)

So, the argument is: (1) Davidsonian holism about individual intentional agency; (2) extension of this holism condition to any agent; (3) failure of institutions to satisfy these holistic constraints; so (4) the cited reduction of institutional agency is eliminative. An interesting comparison is with work of Christian List and Philip Pettit. They share with Ludwig premises (1) and (2), but argue that there are important cases, involving responses to "discursive dilemmas", that falsify (3).[12] I wonder whether we should accept (2).

(2) involves a primacy of individual intentional agency. A contrasting thought is that intentional agency is a generic phenomenon one important species of which is individual intentional agency.[13] About that species we can plausibly accept (1). But perhaps there can be intentional agency on the part of an institution, agency that is realized by social-intentional functioning broadly of the sort Ludwig cites as characteristic of institutions (but not of mobs) but without being subject to a strong constraint of holism. If so, we should reject Ludwig's presupposition that the individual case determines "the agency relation." (4, 75, my emphasis) This would allow us to reject (2) and thereby make room for a constructive reduction of institutional agency. Whether we can successfully defend some such model of inter-personal, intention-based realizers of institutional agency in the absence of a strong holism of group attitudes -- and what the implications of this would be -- are, however, matters for another day.

This is a fine book, one that merits and repays careful study.

[1] Thanks to Raymond Carver for this turn of phrase, the reason for which emerges below.

[2] Michael E. Bratman, Shared Agency: A Planning Theory of Acting Together (Oxford University Press, 2014). One difference is that on my view -- but not on Ludwig's -- in a basic case of shared intention relevant intentions of each are out in the open/common knowledge. But I cannot pursue this matter here.

[3] Donald Davidson, "The Logical Form of Action Sentences" in his Essays on Actions and Events 2nd ed. (Oxford University Press, 2001).

[4] In underlining announces Ludwig indicates that in his view what the group does is only analogous to announcements of an individual agent. Similarly in his underlining of mind and thought.  [Editor's note: our website doesn't allow underlining. As a result, we've had here to substitute italics where the reviewer underlined "announces" and "announcement".]

[5] John Searle, Making the Social World: The Structure of Human Civilization (Oxford University Press, 2010), 57-8. Discussed by Ludwig (131-5).

[6] H.L.A. Hart, The Concept of Law 3rd ed. (Oxford University Press, 2012), 56.

[7] Scott J. Shapiro, Legality (Harvard University Press, 2011) at 108: "[there is a] possibility of widespread official alienation. Suppose most judges accept their appointment to the bench simply in order to collect their paychecks." My concerns here about alienated officials owe to Shapiro's work.

[8] Though, Ludwig also indicates that his target is "the essential nature of collective action and institutional agency". (3)

[9] So talk of institutional agents is only a "façon de parler". (4)

[10] J. David Velleman, "What Happens When Someone Acts?" Mind 101 (403): 461-481 (1992).

[11] Donald Davidson, "Agency," and "Mental Events," in his Essays on Actions and Events 2nd ed.

[12] Christian List and Philip Pettit, Group Agency: The Possibility, Design, and Status of Corporate Agents (Oxford University Press, 2011).

[13] Olle Blomberg points to a version of this idea in his "Practical Knowledge and Acting Together," in J. Adam Carter, Andy Clark, Jesper Kallestrup, Orestis Palermos and Duncan Pritchard (eds.), Socially Extended Epistemology (Oxford University Press, forthcoming).