From Principles to Practice: Normativity and Judgement in Ethics and Politics

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Onora O'Neill, From Principles to Practice: Normativity and Judgement in Ethics and Politics, Cambridge University Press, 2018, 226pp., $84.99 (hbk), ISBN 9781107113756.

Reviewed by Sam Fleischacker, University of Illinois at Chicago


Onora O’Neill has had one of the most distinguished careers of anyone working in moral philosophy today. Her earlActing on Principle was a landmark in Kant scholarship: along with the early writings of Christine Korsgaard and Barbara Herman, it was one of the first modern efforts to make clear, rigorous sense of how exactly Kant’s categorical imperative might work in practice. Her Constructions of Reason included the best papers I have ever seen on what Kant might mean by “the public use of reason,” and on how the categorical imperative may be Kant’s fundamental principle of both moral and epistemic reasoning. After that, while continuing to work on Kant, O’Neill moved on to make major contributions to how we think about poverty, bioethics, and trust. And beginning in the 1990s, she held a series of major administrative positions, including Principal of Newnham College, President of the British Academy, Chair of Britain’s Equality and Human Rights Commission, and Chair of the Nuffield Foundation. She is, in short, the sort of figure about whom one wonders if she ever has time to sleep.

I mention all this in part because if this latest book is not O’Neill’s best work, it’s well to remember that she has done a great deal of other work for which we should be profoundly grateful. I also mention it because the number of enormously time-consuming responsibilities O’Neill has taken on over the past 25 years may help explain what is disappointing about the book. For the materials in this volume look like they were written in relatively short stretches of time, pulled away from other tasks, and then brought together in an equally brief period. The fourteen essays were almost all written for different occasions — one seems to have been a book review, another appeared in a report put out by the Hastings Center for bioethics, others were talks or contributions to collections on Kant or contemporary moral philosophy — and have been only lightly edited for this occasion. The result is that three or four themes and arguments appear over and over again, often in almost exactly the same wording. That’s perfectly reasonable when one piece is meant for an audience of bioethicists and another for an audience of Kant specialists. Juxtaposed in one volume, the repetition is tiring and it gets frustrating to see points that were sketched cursorily in one piece re-appear without further elaboration in another.

That said, the book includes a number of richly interesting pieces. The opening essay provides a nuanced and sympathetic reading of G.E.M. Anscombe’s famous critique of “modern moral philosophy,” suggesting, among other things, that at bottom Anscombe’s critique of secular law-based conceptions of morality rested on a view of moral norms as not laws at all, but rather divine decrees: “[Anscombe’s] view of a divine conception of ethics,” says O’Neill, “far from being Thomist was radically antinomian.” (25) This is an extremely intriguing re-interpretation of Anscombe, which could open up the reception of Anscombe to an entirely new direction.

Next we get two pieces exploring the relationship between science and ethics: but not in the tired ways that people usually tackle that subject. O’Neill asks neither about the ethical constraints we might put on how we do scientific experiments and use scientific technology nor about the metaphysical considerations that may rule out, or allow for, attributing truth to moral claims. Instead, she suggests that “the very thought that we can exhaustively classify norms as ethical and non-ethical may be tenuous” (38), and points to (ethical?) norms that are essential to any successful pursuit of science: “commitments to recording data accurately, to modifying or rejecting hypotheses when they are falsified, or to honesty in scientific communication” (44). She adds that science needs “norms of communicating in ways that are intelligible to and assessable by intended audiences”: “openness” is essential to science, and not just “a nice ‘add-on’ feature.” (50; see also 39). The extreme value-neutrality promoted by mid-twentieth century positivists is thus not so much an option for science. (These points seem to me to resonate with O’Neill’s argument for the categorical imperative as a principle guiding all thought, not just moral thought, but she does not explicitly draw that connection here.)

Four pieces in the book are devoted to elements of Kant’s moral theory. Three of these deal primarily with the question of what Kantian practical judgment looks like, which I will take up below as the main theme of this review. The remaining one addresses the relationship between duties of virtue and duties of justice, a subject that has been of interest to O’Neill throughout her career. She focuses here on whether Kant can possibly regard the distinction between these two types of duty as exclusive and exhaustive, as he sometimes suggests, and whether the idea that duties of justice are enforceable while duties of virtue are not can possibly be the best way of distinguishing between them. Since at least two duties of justice are not enforceable (the duty of equity and the duty to set up systems of justice in the first place), and since many duties of justice are also duties of virtue, on Kant’s own account, O’Neill suggests that “we have reason to be cautious” about this aspect of Kant’s moral system (221).

There are in addition several pieces that make an eminently sensible case for the importance of reason to the resolution of practical disputes, as against relativists who question whether we can or should employ reason across cultural divides (see 67-70 and 145-50, especially), as well as a nice paper on how even non-consequentialists can give some role to potential consequences in their ethical reasoning. I shall not dwell on these topics, however, so as to make room for the central issue in this book: what a Kantian account of practical judgment might look like, and how it improves on the particularist modes of thinking often described as “moral judgment” by such writers as John McDowell, David Wiggins, and Jonathan Dancy.

O’Neill makes all of the following points about practical judgment:

  1. The problem of figuring out which of several possible acts to carry out is just as difficult for utilitarians as for Kantians, despite the apparent algorithm that the former purport to offer for solving that problem. Given that no actual decision maker can possibly either individuate all her options exhaustively, or foresee the likely consequences of most of them, or figure out a plausible way of comparing the utilities of the people affected by her actions, no-one can in fact select the option with maximal utility (59-60, 79, 142, 167).
  2. Principles in general, and Kantian principles in particular, are not algorithmic. They may rule out certain kinds of actions but do not dictate any particular act (there are many ways of keeping promises, not lying, helping others, etc.). Algorithms can function only in highly formal contexts — mathematical contexts, especially — where the practice we are engaged in specifies exactly what will count as following or not following a rule.
  3. Kant himself notes the impossibility of giving rules for how to follow rules, and saw judgment, understood as the application of rules to particular cases, as a “peculiar talent which can be practiced only,” not something that could be specified in a determinate way (CPR A 133-4/B 172-3; discussed by O’Neill on 59, 93-4, 110-2, and 121-2). He also explicitly allows, in a number of places, for a certain latitude in figuring out what we ought to do morally (e.g., Metaphysics of Morals 6:390, discussed by O’Neill on 87 and 92).
  4. The supposed radical indeterminacy of Kantian moral judgment, by which moral rules leave entirely open what we ought to do on a particular occasion, can be significantly reduced once we recognize that we never apply single rules. Just as, when I go shopping, my choice about whether to buy margarine or not is constrained by my thoughts about how much I can afford to spend and what my spouse wants to eat and such norms as “not stealing [or] assaulting the shopkeeper,” so when I consider whether to give someone advice or lend them money my decision about what to do will be informed by my thoughts about how to be honest and kind and respectful of his or her freedom and protective of his or her safety (82-3, 116-7). And in both cases, the multiplicity of principles of action narrows down the options for me, even if it doesn’t determine a single right or best action.

I whole-heartedly endorse all of these points, and think the last of them, especially, is a significant new contribution to how we should think about the implementation of Kant’s moral philosophy. But O’Neill adds two further points, which constitute the heart of what she takes to be her own theory of Kantian moral judgement:

  1. Neither what Kant, in the third Critique, calls “determinant judgment” (the application of a rule/principle to a particular case) nor what he calls “reflective judgment” (the attempt to discover rules/principles under which to put particular cases) properly characterize practical judgment (90-91, 132, 185). That is because these forms of judgment always take a particular thing or event as given, while in morality the task is to bring about a thing or event. Practical judgment should therefore be seen as “enacting” principles rather than either applying or discovering them. O’Neill likes to cite a passage from Kant’s “Theory and Practice” essay in this connection, which speaks of the Ausübung of principles rather than their Anwendung (105, 115, 132). Ausübung is the word she translates as “enactment.”
  2. The capacity for “reading” situations aright — “perceiving” what is salient in them, or interpreting them the way we interpret a text — so central to the accounts of moral judgment in writers like McDowell and Wiggins is not in fact a form of moral judgment at all. It is instead a version of reflective judgment, parsing situations that have gone by, rather than considering what to do in the future. O’Neill describes this kind of judgment as “essentially third-personal” and focused on “a particular situation that is already present to be judged,” rather than on “producing or shaping a particular act or pattern of action that is yet to be done” (89). It conduces to a “moral connoisseurship” that is suitable to a spectator of moral action rather than to a moral agent (92, 202).

I’d like to make one small, textual point about these claims, and then a larger, more systematic one. The textual point, in response to 5, is that Ausübung (literally, “working out” or “practise”) is not clearly distinct from Anwendung. Moreover, Kant himself never indicates, as far as I am aware, that the implementation of the categorical imperative is anything other than the application of a rule to a particular instance. If there is a need for a “practical judgment” that is distinct from both reflective and determinant judgment, Kant does not indicate that. Perhaps O’Neill is nevertheless right: perhaps in carrying out actions we are somehow expressing our commitment to various principles rather than applying those principles. But the distinction between these two things is not easy to see, and neither the little that she herself says about it, nor any of the sources she cites from Kant, help to clarify it.

Now to the systematic point, which concerns point 6: the construal of moral judgment as at least centrally involving something like “reflective judgment” (a view to which my own Third Concept of Liberty is devoted). O’Neill I think misses a crucial aspect of the way in which those of us who see moral judgment in this way think of the “perceiving” or “interpreting” that is supposed to go on: that we are to imagine our own proposed actions into whatever scene we are trying to perceive or interpret virtuously, and then try to see how we might, after acting, regard ourselves.

Suppose, to take one of O’Neill’s own examples, I need “to break some bad news in a way that is honest, does not undermine the confidence of the person hearing it, and yet is not so shrouded in euphemism that the message does not get across.” (83) Or suppose, to adapt an example from Iris Murdoch which inspired a great deal of the perception literature in ethics, that I am trying to treat my somewhat undignified daughter-in-law with heartfelt respect, in place of the “correct” but hypocritical courtesy that has marked my behaviour towards her thus far. In both cases, I can achieve my nuanced aim only if I think about my particular character in relation to the particular person to whom I need to break news or whom I am trying to treat with respect. What is this person like, to whom I need to break news — how good is he at understanding gentle hints, and at facing bad news? What will offend or embarrass my particular daughter-in-law? And what kind of honest advisor or respectful father-in-law do I want to be, and am I capable of being? I also try to focus on the details of the alternative ways of acting that I consider. I imagine myself breaking the news in this way or that, or inviting my daughter-in-law to lunch in this way or that. Then I scan the imagined scene of my action, and try to figure out whether the character who spoke my lines would come off as tactful rather than boorish, in the first case, and a respectful father-in-law rather than a condescending snob, in the second. These thoughts seem essential, if I want to enact or express my particular character in relation to other particular people in a particular society at a particular moment in history; that is the motivation for working through a mode of thinking that looks more like literary interpretation than the implementation of universal rules. But the “act or pattern of action that is yet to be done” by me is present throughout my reflections, and these reflections are supposed to guide me throughout the actions I undertake, not just in looking back at them afterwards. So this model of moral judgment is not a retrospective or a spectatorial one, even if a spectatorial stance plays a central role in it: the spectatorial stance simply guides the agent’s view of his or her own agency.

I do not mean, here, to argue for this model of moral judgment, just to say that O’Neill misses its central features, in her critique of particularism. I also do not mean to set up this reflective kind of moral judgment in opposition to acting on principle; I doubt that that is the right reading, either, of most modern particularists, including McDowell. (McDowell famously rejects the idea that moral outlooks can be “codified”: but in that he sets himself simply against algorithmic moral thinking, which O’Neill also opposes.) Principles may well inform our reflections: I may well aim to uphold general principles of honesty and respect even while expressing my particular conception of how to be an honest advisor or respectful father-in-law to the particular people with whom I am interacting. It is just that those principles play a background role in setting up the scene and the characters into which I imagine my actions, rather than determining what exactly happens in that scene. Enacting certain principles is one of the most important things a virtuous agent needs to do, on the reflective conception of moral judgment I am describing; it is just not the only thing that that agent needs to do.

I would have liked to have seen O’Neill take up a view of this sort in some detail, when laying out her quite different view of judgment, instead of dismissing the Wittgenstein and Aristotelian strands of modern moral philosophy as missing the whole point of moral deliberation. I would also have liked to have heard more about how exactly her view works — how exactly “enacting” a principle is different from “applying” one. That said, O’Neill’s view is highly intriguing, both in itself and as a reading of Kant. And for all its repetitiveness, the book as a whole is a rich collection, full of wisdom on a wide variety of topics.