From Psychology to Morality: Essays in Ethical Naturalism

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John Deigh, From Psychology to Morality: Essays in Ethical Naturalism, Oxford University Press, 2018, 275pp., $85.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780190878597.

Reviewed by Karsten R. Stueber, College of the Holy Cross


Since ancient times, philosophers have wondered how exactly to account for the status of morality in the lives of human beings. Ancient philosophers were very much concerned with understanding how our moral lives are grounded in the structure of our psyche and how its various parts, specifically reason and emotions, contribute to making us moral agents who feel bound by the demands of virtue and justice. Yet merely integrating psychological considerations within the context of one's moral philosophy is a necessary but not a sufficient condition for counting as an ethical naturalist. Plato certainly had some interesting things to say about moral psychology, but he argued that the objectivity of moral judgments and the authority of moral norms are ultimately grounded in an intellectual realm, distinct from the natural world accessible to our senses. Similarly, for Kant (as traditionally read) our moral agency is made possible because we are not merely part of the empirical world studied by the natural sciences but because we are also allowed to think about ourselves as being part of a noumenal world. It is for that very reason that Plato and Kant cannot count as ethical naturalists. Commitment to naturalism, as conceived by John Deigh, however, does not require one to be a sentimentalist like David Hume. Rather Deigh views even Aristotle as a naturalist, since even though he viewed moral agency as being tied to our capacity for reason, he understood reason "to function entirely within the natural world" (2).

In his book, John Deigh has collected twelve essays (eleven of them have been previously published) that articulate his naturalist conception of the moral realm. While Aristotle certainly is one of his naturalist heroes in the ancient world and he follows him in arguing for a cognitivist understanding of emotions, Deigh's essays exclusively address issues and positions that have gained prominence in modern and contemporary philosophy. He focuses particularly on thinkers such as Hume, William James, Freud, Bernard Williams, Henry Sidgwick, and Peter F. Strawson. As one has come to expect from Deigh's writings, all of the essays are easily accessible (even to students who want to get a first introduction to the lay of the land), provide very illuminating critiques of the positions of the main players in contemporary metaethics and moral psychology, and constitute thought-provoking explorations of the substantial issues in these areas.

In regard to the naturalist project in ethics, that is, of "explaining moral thought and action as wholly natural phenomena," as the front flap promises, the first half of the book constitutes its core, and the question of whether Deigh succeeds in this respect will be at the center of this review. The topics that Deigh addresses in the first three articles overlap to some extent with his essays collected in an earlier book, Emotions, Value, and the Law (OUP 2008). Nevertheless, they situate Deigh's own broadly cognitivist understanding of emotions nicely within a systematic reflection on the historical development of various conceptions of emotions in modernity. The main protagonists here are Hume (with his plurality of distinctions between violent and calm, direct and indirect emotions), James, identifying emotions with feeling of bodily changes, and Freud, who figures prominently and positively in Deigh's own account. Like Freud and in contrast to James, Deigh regards emotions as essentially intentional phenomena and as being essentially linked to evaluative judgments. While he admits that emotions potentially can be expressed and manifested through specific feelings, such feelings do not always have to be actualized. Deigh is particularly concerned with defending his account against neo-Jamesian analyses of emotions proposed by Antonio Damasio and Jesse Prinz, who in Deigh's opinion can account for some evaluative dimension of emotions without, however, being able to sufficiently determine the intentional object of that evaluation. Notice also that Deigh admits that the emotions of animals and infants share only the intentional dimensions with the emotions of mature humans. Fear in dogs, for example, is directed towards objects that are associated with the expectation of pain, but it is not directed towards objects that are conceptualized as being dangerous. Such a conceptual and evaluative dimension is added developmentally at a later stage when our emotional life, as Aristotle suggests, is molded through "moral development and education" (28-29).

Certainly there is a lot to be discussed as far as Deigh's conception of emotions is concerned. One wonders, for example, whether Prinz cannot account for the fact that emotions are directed toward specific objects. Yet, within the context of this review, I am willing to give Deigh the benefit of doubt. The central question is whether Deigh is able to come up with a philosophically plausible account of the importance of morality for our lives in light of his understanding of our psychology and our emotional nature. Deigh seems enamored of Freud and his descriptions of the dynamics of various parts of the soul (chapter three), since as a naturalist he favors something like Freud's story about how the superego with its idealized conception of originally parental norms can account for a moral sense of guilt and conscience over Kant's more spiritualistic explication (chap. 3). Yet here one has to proceed rather carefully. Certainly, one might grant that something like a Freudian account (if it were to be validated by what the sciences tell us about human psychology) could explain why we care about norms that the community we live in regards as moral norms, and why we might feel guilty in violating such norms. Kant, however, did not merely want to address such factual questions. Rather, he was concerned with explicating why moral norms possessing strict universality, independent of the social practices we are part of, have normative authority over us and make valid normative demands on us. Kant was thus not merely interested in explaining why we as a matter of fact care about morality, but why we should care about it. One wonders then why Deigh does not also address a naturalistically more plausible version of Kant, as Christine Korsgaard (1996) provides with her constructivist reading.

Fortunately, Deigh does not rely only on Freud in order to account naturalistically for morality. The core of Deigh's answer is to be found in his explorations in chapters five and six where he broadly addresses Strawsonian attempts to illuminate the nature of human morality on the basis of our reactive attitudes. Strawsonian approaches to morality have been rather popular in recent years, particularly due to the work of Jay Wallace (1996) and Stephen Darwall (2006). Deigh argues that Wallace and Darwall ultimately fail to account for morality from a naturalist perspective. Their understanding of the reactive attitudes, particularly of resentment and indignation, are already infused with normative and moral notions. Thus, for example, Darwall seems to assume that in resenting another person's action I make second-personal claims and assume that I have the moral authority to do so. Whether or not both Wallace and Darwall are ultimately committed to Deigh's naturalist perspective is something that is open to interpretation and I think ultimately a bit ambiguous in their work. Yet Deigh is right in emphasizing that their use of Strawson does not help us to explain how morality emerges naturalistically from the reactive attitudes, since Wallace and Darwall infuse them already from the very start with moral and normative notions.

In contrast, Deigh suggests that we stay closer to Strawson's text in thinking of our susceptibility to resentment as an "aspect of our sociability" and not as an "aspect of our rationality" (125). As social creatures, who are emotionally attached to others, we are sensitive to the good-will or ill-will of others, and demand and expect good will from them. Accordingly, we react with resentment if we recognize lack of good-will in the behavior of other people. Yet such a resentful attitude does not presuppose any implicit assumptions about having any normative authority to demand anything from others. Rather, it reveals a basic psychological fact about human beings. Deigh, therefore, also allows for the fact that amoral creatures like psychopaths, human infants, and even some of our closest relatives in the animal kingdom might feel resentment towards others. For Deigh, a genuine moral dimension only emerges in the context of the vicarious analogue of resentment, that is, in our feeling indignant in observing another person not showing good-will towards others. In being capable of indignation we take up a more impartial point of view -- maybe because of something like Hume's notion of a general sympathy with mankind (115) -- due to our generalized expectation that everyone show good-will towards others. The moral circle fully closes when we feel guilty about our own behavior, since guilt should be understood as the self-reactive analogue of indignation. We thus include ourselves among those to which generalized expectations about human behavior apply, thereby putting ourselves on equal footing with every other member of the moral community.

According to Deigh's reading, the moral stance supposedly emerges from mere resentment without any normative features through a process of generalization and reflective self-application. Yet it remains ultimately inexplicable in Deigh's reading of Strawson why such a generalized expectation of good-will introduces any genuine normative features, that is, why adopting this stance should provide me with any normative authority to make any demands on you. Here one would like to have heard a bit more about how the normative force of moral judgments is grounded in mere dispositional properties such as having certain expectations. In this context, one might consult the work of Christina Bicchieri (2006), who analyzes social normativity in terms of a mutual web of expectations including expectations of sanctions. Nevertheless, the scope of such analysis of social normativity tends to be limited to the boundaries of a particular social group. From a naturalist perspective, it seems rather doubtful that mere generalizations will allow us to adopt a stance that sufficiently shares the characteristic of the moral stance, where we view all humans as being equidistant from each other, as being neither friend nor foe, and as having equal value. As evolutionary and social psychology have taught us, biases towards the out-group are a basic fact of human psychology, similar to the existence of our reactive attitudes. It is thus empirically unlikely that we do expect good-will from a member of the out-group in the same manner that we expect it from the in-group. The fact that we also seem to be indignant towards the behavior of the Romans, long dead and gone, and cited as evidence by Hume (and Deigh) for our genuinely generalizing tendency, proves merely that we regard Roman culture as part of our own culture.

On either interpretation then, that is Deigh or Darwall's, it seems that Strawsonians fall short in explicating morality in a naturalistically plausible manner. Either one is forced to infuse the reactive attitudes with moral normativity right from the start, torpedoing a naturalist explication of morality; or one follows Deigh in conceiving of resentment in a non-normative manner, and faces great difficulty getting normativity back into nature. At most, Strawsonian approaches, or so I am inclined to argue, allow us to understand the emotional deep structure that underlies and maintains our moral practices in a phenomenologically revealing manner. This is certainly not an achievement to be laughed at, but it is not what the naturalist prima facie promises.

Yet it might be that Deigh has a softer version of naturalism in mind, where naturalism is not understood (in contrast to the standard view in contemporary philosophy) as a metaphysical framework that is solely defined by what the natural sciences tell us about nature. Such a softened version of naturalism would indeed square better with Deigh's viewing Aristotle as one of his naturalist heroes. While Aristotle certainly rejected the intellectual realm that Plato appealed to, he nevertheless thought of nature in a much broader sense than we do today: Aristotle thought of nature as a realm that is already infused with normative features whose reality we are prone to recognize through the proper education of our emotions (see also McDowell 1998). Accordingly, one would have liked to have heard a bit more about how exactly Deigh conceives of naturalism and how exactly he thinks of the constraints and demands of a naturalist explication or explanation of morality. Be that as it may, from the perspective of a softened understanding of naturalism, the second half of Deigh's book (containing articles on the necessity of empathy for moral judgments, a discussion and defense of Williams's conception of practical reason and three essays focusing on the nature of punishment as a form of retaliation) certainly provides us with further and highly illuminating insights into the deep structure of our moral and legal lives, even if it does not ground them in a naturalist fashion as standardly understood in contemporary contexts. I highly recommend the anthology to anybody with interests in thinking philosophically about human nature and our moral lives.


Bicchieri, C. 2006. The Grammar of Society: The Nature and Dynamics of Social Norms. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.

Darwall, S. 2006.The Second-Person Standpoint: Morality, Respect, and Accountability. Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press.

Korsgaard, C. 1996. Sources of Normativity. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.

McDowell, J. 1998. "Two Sorts of Naturalism," in Mind, Value, and Reality, 167-197. Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press.

Stueber, K. 2017. "Smithian Constructivism: Elucidating the Reality of the Normative Domain," in R. Debes and K. Stueber (eds.), Ethical Sentimentalism: New Perspectives, 192-209. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.

Wallace, J. 1996. Responsibility and the Moral Sentiments, Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press.