From Rules to Meanings: New Essays on Inferentialism

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Ondřej Beran, Vojtěch Kolman, and Ladislav Koreň (eds.), From Rules to Meanings: New Essays on Inferentialism, Routledge, 2018, 357pp., $145.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781138102613.

Reviewed by Preston Stovall, University of Hradec Králové


This volume was produced in response to Jaroslav Peregrin's Inferentialism: Why Rules Matter (2014), and it brings together the work of a number of established and junior philosophers working within this tradition. The essays are grouped into four sections: language and meaning; logic and semantics; rules, agency, and explanation; and history and the present. Collectively they survey some of the ongoing and historical developments in inferentialism, and they lay out guidelines for a systematic and integrated view of the world and our places in it as rational beings. This lends the essays a degree of coherence it can sometimes be difficult to find in edited collections.

With an introduction that canvasses the intellectual background of inferentialism and summarizes the essays, this volume provides a timely update on some of the various projects that have developed in this philosophical tradition. And there is clearly a research program here, one whose participants work closely with related areas in philosophical logic, the philosophy of language, the philosophy of mind, the life sciences, the philosophy of perception, the philosophy of testimony, and the history of philosophy. It will be valuable for those who are either working in these areas, working at the boundaries of these and related areas, or are interested in a state-of-the-art overview of inferentialism as a strand of research that grows out of certain trends in 19th and 20th century European and North American philosophy. After a summary discussion of the individual essays I will use the remainder of this extended review to raise some questions about just what inferentialism is, and to push out in a few directions of further research.

Unsurprisingly, Robert Brandom's work figures heavily in the discussion of a number of these essays. The bulk of the introduction is devoted to surveying the lines of thinking he and others have drawn together, and it provides a remarkably thorough overview of inferentialism and its intellectual roots.

The first four essays cover themes in the philosophy of language. Christopher Gauker's "Grounding Assertion and Acceptance in Mental Imagery" builds a bridge between the representational and inferential sides of cognition by appealing to evolved and habituated cooperative activity and non-conceptual mental images that develop over the course of problem-solving in natural and social settings. Hans-Johann Glock's "Semantics: Why Rules Ought to Matter" argues that the rulish activities that underlie linguistic discursiveness must be conceived to include a dimension of linguistic understanding, an area that has not received much attention among inferentialists. In "Quine Peregrinating: Norms, Dispositions, and Analyticity" Gary Kemp presents a Quinean dispositionalist analysis of normativity. In "Let's Admit Defeat: Assertion, Denial, and Retraction" Bernhard Weiss examines the prospect of treating both assertion and denial as primitive semantic attitudes.

The next six essays are devoted to issues in logic and formal semantics. Those with a mind for formal philosophy and its history will enjoy these papers. In "Inferentialism, Structure, and Conservativeness" Ole Hjortland and Shawn Standefer examine foundational issues in proof-theoretic semantics concerning the relationship between the rules of inference for logical operators and the properties of the proof systems defined by those rules. In a similar vein, and at a more programmatic level, Brandom's "From Logical Expressivism to Expressivist Logics: Sketch of a Program and Some Implementations" outlines and motivates his contention that the rules of logic should be understood as devices for making explicit the material inferential connections that hold among the non-logical concepts of a language.

Two essays in this section critique elements of Brandom's expressivist program for logic. Lionel Shapiro's "Logical Expressivism and Logical Relations" argues that logical vocabulary expresses something about our attitudes rather than about relations among the sentences of a language. This interesting essay will repay close study. Ladislav Koreň's "Propositional Contents and the Logical Space" argues that Brandom's conception of a linguistic community whose members do not use logical vocabulary is a conception of a community whose linguistic utterances are too imprecise to count as conceptually contentful. He proposes a view of logic as a device that enables a community to control the use and development of conceptually contentful utterances that already employ logical vocabulary, rather than as something that could be introduced into a language via a set of pre-logical inferences that the logic makes explicit.

Finally, two essays look at the relationship between inferential relations and logical operators. In "Inferentialist-Expressivism for Explanatory Vocabulary" Jared Millson, Kareem Khalifa, and Mark Risjord define a non-monotonic proof theory employing explanatory inferences, and on this basis they individuate introduction and elimination rules sufficient to introduce a 'best explains why' operator into the object language over which these rules are imposed. This work has since been developed in Khalifa, Millson, and Risjord (2018) and Millson and Straßer (2019), and it offers a formally precise framework for thinking about explanations of the sort used in scientific inquiry. Peter Milne's "Assertion, Inference, and the Conditional" is wide-ranging, examining the normative constraints imposed on assertion, the relationship between belief revision and logical consequence, and the prospect of developing a probability analysis for the natural language indicative conditional.

Four essays are grouped under "Rules, Agency, and Explanation". In "Naturecultural Inferentialism" Joseph Rouse argues that we can understand human rationality if we adopt a theoretical framework that foregrounds "our lives and lineage as organisms, perceptually and practically responsive to a partially shared biological environment" (239). Peregrin's "Inferentialism: Where Do We Go from Here?" examines the prospect of reconciling the normative framework of inferentialist semantics with recent developments in the scientific understanding of human psychology. In "The Nature and Diversity of Rules" Vladimír Svoboda draws on work from Peregrin, Cristina Bicchieri, Wilfrid Sellars, G.H. von Wright, and Ludwig Wittgenstein to provide a taxonomy of the kinds of rules one needs to posit when making sense of linguistic behavior as rule governed. The literature on the normativity of meaning would do well to consider the kinds of distinctions Svoboda draws. In "Governed by Rules, or Subject to Rules?" Ondřej Beran uses Rush Rhees' criticism of Wittgenstein on rule following to argue that some of what we say about following a rule should be thought of as an expression of the goal or aim of the practice the rule governs.

The final section is historically oriented. In "Inferentialism After Kant" Danielle Macbeth argues that the inferentialism of Brandom and Peregrin is, despite their avowals, not very Fregean insofar as the latter held that truth and representation were as fundamental as inference. This is an important point to emphasize, as inferentialism under the influence of Brandom has developed by contrast with representational and truth-conditional theories of meaning. James R. O'Shea's "Inferentialism, Naturalism, and the Ought-to-Bes of Perceptual Cognition" defends Sellars' account of perception as a suitably naturalistic story about how ordinary empirical descriptive vocabulary comes to be meaningful. In "Inferentialism and Its Mathematical Precursor" Vojtěch Kolman illustrates the sense in which David Hilbert's axiomatic approach to mathematics anticipates the development of inferentialist theories of meaning. Finally, Leila Haaparanta's "Inferentialism and the Reception of Testimony" examines the interaction between inferentialism in the philosophy of language and inferentialism in the epistemology of testimony, and argues that to accept someone's testimony is to recognize them as a certain kind of person.

The theoretical framework these philosophers have developed offers fertile ground for rethinking a range of issues in philosophy, and many of the foundational positions underlying current philosophical debate in the Anglophone world thereafter show up as optional. But inferentialism offers more than a deconstructive analysis of recent trends in different parts of philosophy. It also provides a framework with its own explanatory virtues and challenges.

One of those challenges concerns just how to think of inferentialism. For the term will be used a bit differently when applied to logicians and philosophers of language, or epistemologists and philosophers of perception. In a movement as varied as this it can be hard to know how to survey the field. This volume does that well. What is lacking is a sense of the whole as a whole. But one cannot fault the editors for not providing that unifying conception, as it is not clear there is one.

Nevertheless, it is often useful to take several otherwise disparate ideas and think them together under some new more general understanding of them as species of this new genus. As Peregrin (2014, p. 22-3) emphasizes, it is to our benefit that we have general concepts under which to subsume particular ones, for by doing so we compress information into more manageable loads. Where falling under any terms F1 to Fn suffices for falling under the term K, and where falling under K entails falling under each of G1 to Gm, in the absence of K a language that encoded these relations would have to specify inferential links from each Fi to each Gi. With K, however, there need only be the inferential links from each Fi to K, together with those from K to each Gi. The result is that a language including K can make do with n + m inferential rules whereas without K, and with the same expressive power, a language requires n 𝗑 m rules. Toward the end of forging a more precise understanding of inferentialism, then, it may help to think about how to characterize inferentialism in general terms even if, as yet, there is no clear sense what the genus is.

As a first pass, inferentialism can be understood as the view that linguistic meaning, and the intentionality and contentfulness of thought, is to be understood in terms of the rational relations that govern linguistic and mental activity. This program can be characterized (using resources Brandom has helped us conceive more clearly) as a series of commitments in the philosophies of language and logic that prioritizes the notion of a rule-governed proof system as a basis from which to understand the semantic contentfulness of language and thought. Various examinations of the different senses in which rules are meaning-conferring have been investigated in proof theory, and it may help to draw those resources more to the fore. Francez 2015 and Garson 2013 offer extended investigations on this front, and Brandom and his students have been working on meaning-conferring non-monotonic proof systems for some time, the first results of which are now being published (e.g. Hlobil 2016 and 2018, and Kaplan 2018).

Use of proof theory as a basis for understanding inferentialism helps illustrate some of the strengths of the program. According to the proof-theoretic semanticist, the meaning of a sentence is a function of the rules that govern the occurrences of that sentence in the premises and conclusions of inferences. To date most of the work on meaning-conferring rules in proof theory has focused on the introduction and elimination rules associated with the logical operators, and on the relationship between different rule formats and the deduction systems (e.g. classical or intuitionistic) defined by them. Where semantic values for atomic sentences are discussed, they are generally assumed given from outside the proof system. An adequate semantics for atomic sentences remains an open problem for proof-theoretic semantic systems (cf. Pezlar 2017 and the Afterword to Francez 2015).

Here the philosophical work of someone like Sellars or Peirce may point the way forward. For there is a longstanding idea lying behind inferentialist theories of meaning: some inferences are underwritten by the material content of the non-logical concepts contained within them. Non-extensional notions of meaning of this sort, often glossed in terms of concept containment relations, have been discussed as 'comprehension' by the Port Royal logicians, 'Inhalt' by Kant, 'connotation' by Mill, and 'Sinn' by Frege.

This emphasis on the proof-theoretic dimension of inferentialism has the benefit of making sense of a prominent divide in the study of formal and informal languages. Model theory has been far more prevalent than proof theory in the work that logicians, philosophers, and linguists have undertaken since the middle of the 20th century, and the model-theoretic presuppositions of the twentieth century have influenced the way researchers approach a range of issues. Linguistic meaning is almost exclusively secured via referential relations between words and the world, with sentence meaning specified by truth conditions (Gibbard's 2003, as a model-theoretic but expressivist semantics, is a notable exception).

It is an irony of the way model theory took hold in certain circles that 'intension' came to be co-extensional with 'extension at a possible world' in the twentieth century, as this occludes the notion of intension that was originally signified by that term. This is important because some of the problems that have occupied philosophers over the last few decades are artifacts of the emphasis on model-theoretic and representational theories of meaning. It is, for instance, unsurprising that the insufficient fineness of grain that attends possible-worlds analyses of meaning would lead to the felt need to posit more rarified model-theoretic resources like property, essence, and ground.

The proof theorist is in a different dialectical position with regard to these debates. Rather than apportioning meaning to object-language sentences on the basis of representational relations specified by a metalanguage employing models that give truth conditions for those sentences under an interpretation, she specifies the meanings of object-language sentences in a metalanguage that lays down rules for inferring to and from those sentences in the object language. In doing so she dispenses with the need to answer a range of metaphysical questions that the model theorist, who uses a metalanguage of objects, properties, worlds, essences, etc., must face. One way of seeing the development of inferentialism, and especially its emphasis on so-called 'intensional' operators like the subjunctive conditional and the alethic and deontic modalities, is as a proof-of-concept that the philosopher need not engage in metaphysical speculation in order to make sense of what we say and do when we speak.

The inferentialist does owe us some story about the rules she posits in her metalanguage, of course, and of how these rules suffice to make us into the kinds of rational beings we are. But that effort has been underway at least since Hegel's discussion of Sprache as the Dasein of Geist in the Phenomenology of Spirit (§652). And if the proof-theoretic semanticist can interpret some apparently representational vocabulary in terms of the rules that govern its use, without having to use that vocabulary in order to understand how we obey those rules, then there may be no representational commitment involved in the everyday use of that vocabulary (Brandom 2008 is an emblematic working out of this idea). It is good to see so many of the essays address this aspect of the program, and it is clear that even where philosophical anthropology (or what used to be called 'the philosophy of nature') is not the topic, the view has been framed with that topic in mind.

This brings me to my first suggestion for expanding the project to which this volume contributes. Analytic metaphysics was fueled by the rise of representational model theories, and questions of consciousness, possibilities, essence, etc. have been almost exclusively pursued as ontological questions: what are these things we speak of? The proof-theoretic deontologist instead asks: how do (or should) we talk about these things? Depending on whether the modal auxiliary is used, the project is either descriptive or prescriptive. And though it might be called a project in metaphysics, it is not the project of mapping the world's ontology -- it is rather a project of self- and communal-understanding (the connection to German idealism again makes a showing).

Because model-theoretic semantics are dominant in linguistics, inferentialism offers something to that discipline as well. Part II of Francez (2015) provides a proof-theoretic semantics for fragments of natural language, but to date this research has been undertaken almost exclusively by logicians.

More work on the historical antecedents of inferentialism would also be welcome. The movements drawn together under inferentialism are a disparate lot, inspired by figures that do not otherwise have much in common. Focusing just on inferentialist conceptions of logic, it does not take much effort to subsume together such apparently dissimilar projects as the Subjective Logic of Hegel and the work of Gerhard Gentzen on proof theory in the 1930s, or the realist logics of Peirce and the intuitionistic logics that Dummett championed. Cases like this show that there is some measure of interconnectedness between the various camps within inferentialism, though the details are insufficiently precise as to need careful examination. Much of this work remains to be done. Despite the effort of philosophers like Brandom and Pirmin Stekeler-Weithofer, the number of people conversant in the ideas of both Hegel and Gentzen remains rather small. Additional attention to the particulars of these different positions will help sort out just what the field of commitments and possibilities looks like.

Finally, research into inferentialism will profit from continued investigation into the biological and social grounds of human cognition. This volume contributes to that end, and Peregrin puts the point well:

I am convinced that Brandomian inferentialism should not only be compatible with the results of relevant empirical research, but that it is virtually impossible to separate its philosophical from its empirical part. (p.258)

Above I said that a proof-theoretic approach to metaphysical vocabulary absolves the philosopher of an apparent need to adopt metaphysical oddities into her ontology. That may be so, but insofar as this explanatory framework is to hang together, its architects must be familiar with -- and make use of -- current work in the relevant natural and social sciences. For if human cognition is not to appear naturalistically mysterious, and if merely animal cognition is categorially different from the rule-governed activities of discursive intentionality, then we are owed some line of explanation and understanding that gets us from there to here. What seems needed is a notion of cognition sufficiently capacious as to include both rational and non-rational instances.

Some friends of inferentialism may bristle at the suggestion that cognition could be thought to involve specifications of both non-linguistic animal cognition and the rational cognition characteristic of human beings. After all, philosophers in this tradition generally conceive of rational cognition as the actualizations of a capacity for self-determination or autonomy. The idea, given perspicuous treatment in an early essay by Brandom (1983), is that assertion should be conceived as a discursive commitment in which one binds oneself and is bound by others to the rules that govern the language. Because a discursive commitment is the kind of thing that is subject to public assessment in the context of the rest of one's discursive commitments and entitlements, and those of the rest of the community, this view of rational cognition centers its explanatory framework on the socio-linguistic activities of historical communities.

It would seem that animal cognition involves none of this. But so long as we have the right commentary on the model, I see no reason to bar an analogical understanding of animal cognition on the basis of rational cognition (or vice versa for that matter). And, as logicians have recognized for centuries, one function of analogical reasoning is to subsume otherwise disparate notions together as species under a new genus.

Furthermore, the effort to construct a theory of cognition sufficient to cover both human rationality and merely animal cognition is itself an exercise of the autonomy of reason. For the process of reflection, comparison, abstraction, and analogy needed to subsume particulars under a new universal is rife with the lunges and feints that characterize the free play of the faculty of judgment in its reason-seeking mode (to put the point in Kantian terminology). It would seem, then, that the philosophical program advanced by these essays remains a living thing; though how it will develop and just what its concept is remain open to discovery.


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-- (2008). Between Saying and Doing: Towards an Analytic Pragmatism. New York: Oxford University Press.

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Garson, James W. (2013). What Logics Mean: From Proof Theory to Model-Theoretic Semantics. (New York: Cambridge University Press).

Gibbard, Allan (2003). Thinking How to Live (Cambridge: Harvard University Press).

Hlobil (2016). "A Nonmonotonic Sequent Calculus for Logical Expressivist Inferentialists". In Pavel Arazim and Michal Dancak (eds.) The Logica Yearbook 2015, p. 87-105 (College Publications: London).

-- (2018). "Choosing Your Nonmonotonic Logic: A Shopper's Guide." In Pavel Arazim and Tomáš Lávička (eds.) The Logica Yearbook 2017, p.109-123 (London: College Publications).

Kaplan, Dan (2018). "A multi-succedent sequent calculus for logical expressivists". In Pavel Arazim and Tomáš Lávička (eds.) The Logica yearbook 2017, p. 139-153 (London: College Publications).

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Millson, Jared and Christian Straßer (2019). "A Logic for Best Explanation". Journal of Applied Non-Classical Logics: 1-48.

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Pezlar, Ivo (2017). Review of Proof-Theoretic Semantics, by Nissim Francez. Mind 126 (501): 299-304.