From the Knowledge Argument to Mental Substance: Resurrecting the Mind

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Howard Robinson, From the Knowledge Argument to Mental Substance: Resurrecting the Mind, Cambridge University Press, 2016, 270pp., $99.99 (hbk), ISBN 9781107087262.

Reviewed by Derek Ball, University of St Andrews


The title of Howard Robinson's book undersells its wide-ranging content and ambitious aims; as Robinson writes in his concluding paragraph, he defends a picture of the way things are that "does not merely resurrect the mind, but reinstates its role as the centre of our reality" (259). He repudiates both physicalism and standard forms of dualism, and defends a view on which the mind is an immaterial substance, there are no physical individuals, and everything from ordinary objects to the categories of the special sciences is mind-dependent.

Some readers may find themselves feeling rather distant from Robinson's views and from some of the considerations he brings to bear in support of them. There were several points at which I, for one, found claims he regards as obvious and intuitively dubitable, and several points (notably including the Plotinus-inspired "transcendental conventionalist" view of unity defended in the final chapter) at which I found his views difficult even to understand. Nonetheless there is much to admire in the breadth and originality of Robinson's position, and the book makes interesting contributions to many central philosophical debates. In what follows I will try to sketch some of the main lines of argument, as well as to indicate some possible lines of objection.

The early chapters focus on developing and defending the knowledge argument. (Though the argument is typically associated with Frank Jackson's Mary case, Robinson has a good claim to be one of its inventors, as he independently developed a version in his Matter and Sense (Cambridge, 1982).) The argument is roughly that knowing all of the physical facts does not put one in a position to know all of the phenomenal facts, so the phenomenal facts must not be among the physical facts and physicalism must be false. Robinson objects (in many cases persuasively) to standard physicalist responses, including the ability hypothesis, the phenomenal concept strategy, Jackson's representationalist response, and Dennett's insistence that the idea that someone could know all the physical facts without knowing what it is like is a result of a failure of philosophical imagination. (Robinson also criticizes other physicalist views that might be thought to provide a reply to the knowledge argument, including Davidson-style non-reductive physicalism and mysterianism.)

But Robinson does not merely object to particular responses to the knowledge argument. He also claims that all such replies fail for a deeper reason: in assuming that the physicalist has an adequate account of the non-mental realm, they mistake the force of the argument, which is due to its showing that "qualia are essential building blocks of our empirical world" (144), including even the physical as we ordinarily conceive of it. As Robinson puts the point, "Physicalism's real predicament" is that (i) the knowledge argument shows that "Standard physicalism cannot capture the qualitative nature or aspect of reality"; but (ii) "The qualitative is an essential feature of any conception of the physical that goes beyond the purely abstract or mathematically expressed" (134). The result is that (iii) physicalism "cannot give a coherent account of the physical itself" (134).

Many physicalists admit that there is an explanatory gap -- that (even though the phenomenal is ultimately nothing over and above the physical) there can be no satisfying explanatory account of the phenomenal in purely physical terms -- and such physicalists will be inclined to grant (i). But on the most natural reading of (ii), the validity of the argument can be questioned. What is (more or less) uncontroversial is that experience shapes our conception or understanding of physical reality. Perhaps it is even true that we could have only a very deficient (purely abstract or mathematical) understanding of physical reality, or indeed no understanding of physical reality at all, if we had no experiences. So it is plausible that consciousness is essential to our understanding of the physical. But if (ii) is understood in something like this sense, (iii) does not follow. All that would follow is that physicalism cannot give a satisfying explanatory account of our understanding of physical reality. And this is something that the physicalist who has already bought into the explanatory gap may be quite willing to accept.

In order to establish that physicalism cannot give an account of the physical itself, Robinson would need to understand (ii) as saying that the qualitative is an essential feature of the physical on any substantive conception of the physical. And this seems to be the crux of the argument: Robinson reformulates the argument in various ways, but as far as I can tell each of them relies on moving from the claim that our conception of the physical world essentially depends on experience, to the claim that the physical world itself essentially depends on experience. But I am not sure that I understand his justification for this claim. Why cannot the physicalist insist that the nature of reality is one thing, and the necessary conditions for our understanding that nature are quite another?

Robinson considers an objection along these lines: "surely [the physicalist] is not denied the resource of sense-experience in forming his conception" (139). His response is that the physicalist "is not allowed to draw essentially on the subjective dimension of experience -- on what it is like to experience the world -- in forming his conception of the physical nature of the world, for his conception is one committed to the availability of a purely objective account of the world" (139). But what exactly does this commitment amount to? One sense in which an account might be objective is that all of the entities and properties it postulates are objective. It is surely right that the physicalist is committed to there being an account of the world that is objective in this sense. But it is not clear why the physicalist cannot insist that understanding such an account may require experience. Robinson's argument seems to require the claim that the physicalist is committed to the availability of an account that can be formed or grasped without essential appeal to experience. But it is not obvious that the physicalist must accept this. On its face, physicalism is an ontological doctrine, not a doctrine about what conceiving or grasping may require. (It seems compatible with physicalism that it is a necessary truth that all conceptual activity, including grasping any account of anything, must draw essentially on experience.)

Robinson's second main theme is that phenomena that are not metaphysically basic or fundamental are mind-dependent. His first case is the special sciences. Robinson defends a Fodorian view of the special sciences, according to which the concepts of special sciences are not definable in lower-level (e.g. physical) terms, and there are no bridging laws linking the concepts of special sciences to physics. Robinson accepts that the truths of the special sciences are a priori deducible from the physical truths; but in contrast to Jackson and Chalmers and others who have discussed this sort of view, Robinson denies that this entails that the entities and properties of the special sciences are ontologically nothing over and above the physical entities and properties. On the contrary, he insists that the failure of stronger forms of reduction suggests that there is "something further which cannot be deemed simply identical with the base level" (156). If this is right, Robinson thinks, we face a dilemma: either the properties of the special sciences are simply distinct from the physical properties, in which case they are epiphenomenal (given the causal closure of the physical); or the properties of the special sciences are a matter of "'top-down' conceptual interpretation of the base", which is his preferred view. The idea is that the special sciences (notably including psychology) are a matter of "the same portion of the physical world . . . being viewed from outside in a variety of ways for a variety of purposes", and so are "formed from the collaboration between, on the one hand, objective similarities in the world and, on the other, perspectives and interests of those that devise the science" (157).

Robinson's main argument for the broader idea that all non-basic entities are mind-dependent depends on his account of vagueness. This account combines a defense of classical logic, and the idea that there must be a classically consistent description of the world at the level of fundamental ontology, with a denial that this requirement extends to the non-basic levels. Here, he claims, some propositions lack truth values, but this does not mean that we need a three-valued logic; it means that logic does not apply.

One might think that Robinson could stop here. It seems that on the proposed view sorites arguments pose no threat because they are not valid; when we are in the sort of situation where vagueness is an issue, we are in a situation where logic does not apply and no arguments are valid. But this is not Robinson's view. Instead, his account of the problem with sorites arguments turns on the idea that non-basic entities are a matter of our conceptual interpretation of the world. So one should understand the claim that n grains of sand constitutes a heap as asserting something like:

(1) n grains can properly be seen or conceptualized as a heap (174).

Robinson then claims that the second premise of the argument must be:

(2) When something can properly be seen or conceptualized as a heap, then the removal of one grain cannot render it not seen or conceptualized as a heap (174).

He then (correctly) criticizes this argument. But the proposed second premise is not the most natural way of generating a sorites argument from (1). The most natural way of following (1) is as follows:

(2A) When something can properly be seen or conceptualized as a heap, then the removal of one grain cannot make it the case that it cannot properly be seen or conceptualized as a heap.

(2A) is plausible and, given (1), leads to the absurd conclusion that 0 grains can properly be seen or conceptualized as a heap. So it is hard to see how Robinson's discussion of the sorites makes much progress.

Beyond vagueness, Robinson sees many consequences for his "conceptualism". Mereologically composite entities are paradigmatically non-basic, so they are obvious candidates for conceptualist treatment. But Robinson argues further that no physical individuals exist independently of conceptual activity, since all such individuals have vague counterfactual identity conditions. One might be confident that this table could not have been made entirely of ice; but could it have been made of 75% the wood it is actually made of and 25% some other material? Robinson thinks that there is no answer to many such questions: "There will thus be a penumbra of counterfactual cases where the question of whether two things would be the same is not a matter of fact" (195). He rejects views that would make counterfactual identity non-vague, and argues that since "full-fledged individuals can sustain a range of counterfactuals" (194) and physical objects cannot sustain all of these, physical objects must not be full-fledged individuals, but are rather mind-dependent conceptual constructions. The reasoning generalizes to all physical objects; even elementary particles come into existence at a specific point in space and time, and there will be no clear fact of the matter as to whether a given particle could have originated at a slightly different point.

A further application of the conceptualist view is an argument against Dennett-style interpretationism. As Robinson reads Dennett, the view is that the intentional features are a result of being interpreted: "meaning and intentionality must be put into them by the way they are understood" (213). As many have noticed, this appears to generate a sort of regress: there is no intentionality without interpretation, but interpretation is an intentional process, and so seems to require antecedent interpretation. One of Dennett's responses is to deny that interpretation creates intentional features, and to insist instead that interpretation in terms of intentional features picks up on real patterns in the world. But Robinson replies that this move won't work, since patterns (like other non-fundamental entities) are mind-dependent: "the foundations of these judgments of similarity -- the movements of bodies in space -- are entirely real, but their reification as patterns -- as seen as unities of a certain sort -- involves the action of mind" (217).

On Robinson's view it is a conceptual truth that physical objects depend on minds for their existence; but minds depend on bodies and brains only causally and not conceptually. In Robinson's terms, this means that minds are immaterial substances. (Robinson claims further that minds are simple substances -- "one of the world's atomic entities, though in a rather special sense" (235), though this sense is never clearly explained.) The justification for the claim that minds are substances turns on the claim that minds (unlike bodies) must have definite counterfactual identity conditions. When we consider the counterfactual table made from 75% the wood of my actual table and 25% other materials, Robinson claims, there may be no fact of the matter about whether it is identical to my actual table: "the statement 'there is a [table] of a certain sort and composition' gives you all the real or fundamental facts out in the world" (239). But Robinson denies that the same is true of minds: in his view, there is always a fact of the matter about whether a given counterfactual individual is identical to me:

in the case of minds we do have a form of haecceitas which, in a sense, we all understand, namely our identity as subjects. It is because we intuitively understand this that we feel we can give a clear sense to the suggestion that it would, or would not, have been ourselves to which something had happened, if it had happened; and that we feel we can understand very radical counterfactuals -- e.g. that I might have been an ancient Greek or even a non-human -- whereas such radical counterfactuals when applied to mere bodies -- e.g. that this wooden table might have been the other table in the corner or even a pyramid -- makes no intuitive sense. (239)

The examples are plausible enough, and I do not want to suggest that there is nothing to the sort of judgments that Robinson is eliciting; but the situation is hardly as clear as he suggests. We can ask whether I might have been an ancient Greek, but also whether the table might have been made in ancient Greece; likewise whether I could have been a non-human and whether the table could have been a non-table. In each case, the questions make sense. It is harder to make sense of the question of whether the table could have been a different table, and also of the question whether I could have been Socrates or my colleague in the room next door. I feel no marked difference in the sense of the analogous questions about persons and objects, and (contra Robinson) I do not find it obvious that there must be a fact of the matter where minds are at issue if we grant that there is no fact of the matter where bodies are at issue. So Robinson's case for the claim that minds are immaterial substances, though suggestive, is not decisive.