From Violence to Speaking Out: Apocalypse and Expression in Foucault, Derrida and Deleuze

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Leonard Lawlor, From Violence to Speaking Out: Apocalypse and Expression in Foucault, Derrida and Deleuze, Edinburgh University Press, 2016, 320pp., $29.95 (pbk), ISBN 9781474418256.

Reviewed by Jeffrey A. Bell, Southeastern Louisiana University


Leonard Lawlor has continued in this book to do what he has done in his previous one: he applies his perceptive, critical eye to the philosophers and issues that most interest continental philosophers, and in the process provides a unique, helpful way to rethink these philosophers and issues. In the case at hand, Lawlor addresses three of the most significant French philosophers of the latter half of the twentieth century -- Derrida, Foucault, and Deleuze. Despite widespread recognition that these philosophers often overlap in their philosophical approaches (e.g., both Derrida and Deleuze emphasize difference, and Foucault and Deleuze stress a thought of the outside), to date the three have not been brought together as methodically and consistently as they have been here. More precisely, he shows how these three philosophers can be seen to be continuing Nietzsche's effort to reverse Platonism, and thereby a particular understanding of metaphysics. Lawlor argues that Platonic metaphysics involves a particular response to the "transcendental violence" which he claims is an essential condition of all experience. From this it follows that reversing Platonism entails a response to this violence that involves a unique way of speaking that one can find at work in each of Derrida's, Foucault's, and Deleuze (and Guattari's) philosophies. Lawlor's book is neatly divided into two parts, clearly present in the title of the book. Part I focuses on violence, or the 'problem of the worst violence' as Lawlor puts it, and Part II develops the Foucaultian notion of parrēsia (commonly translated as speaking out) to show how Foucault shares with Derrida and Deleuze a similar response to the problem of the worst violence, a response that involves a special way of speaking.

For Lawlor, the problem of the worst violence results from the effort to eliminate an ineliminable violence that is at the basis of all experience, or what Lawlor calls 'transcendental violence,' in further developing themes from Derrida's essay "Violence and Metaphysics." As Lawlor argues, this transcendental violence reflects the fact that experience, or the experience of the event as he elaborates, entails 'two contradictory forces' (50), forces that are at continual war and struggle -- singularization and repetition/universalization. As Lawlor states it, 'Each thought I have, as I speak it, has a kind of novelty to it, giving it a singular location' (ibid.); at the same time, however, such an experience of a thought or an event is more than a mere accident of time and place but also entails an aspect that can be repeated, that can be generalized, universalized, and hence communicated to another. Essential to the nature of this violence, and to the subsequent response it gets, is the fact that our contradictory nature of the experience of an event fails to stay within limits, limits that are always deferred and/or exceeded. The singular breaks with limits that attempt to categorize and capture an experience within a well-worn code and set of routines; and yet the general, repeatable nature of the experience attempts to do just what cannot be done, or it does violence to the nature of the experience. It is for this reason that Lawlor claims 'the worst violence arises from the essential nature of a limit' (15). In other words, the worst violence arises when one attempts to impose limits upon that which is limitless, attempts to remove all possibility of limits being exceeded. Despite this move, however, Lawlor argues that limits involve an 'essential divisibility' (ibid) that renders any limits we may impose merely provisional, and thus subject to further transgressions.

In Part 1 Lawlor focuses on two typical forms of the worst violence as diagnosed by Derrida and Deleuze. In the case of Derrida, he recognizes that a consequence of the divisibility associated with limits is that, as Lawlor puts it, 'the limit is porous, allowing things to mix that should not mix' (17). In response to the powerlessness of preventing the porous nature of the limit we could, and this is the worst response, take 'all of those who might contaminate me [and send] . . . all of them outside to such a degree that I kill them and myself, all of us. The worst is the suicide of all . . . ' (ibid.). Despite any attempt to maintain pure presence, such as the presumption that one is purely present to oneself when speaking (Lawlor provides a helpful analysis of auto-affection and its implications for Derrida), we are powerless to keep that which 'might contaminate me' at bay. In the case of Deleuze (and Guattari), we are confronted with the other side of 'the formula of the powerlessness in the face of the essential divisibility of the limit: the inability to stop escape' (18). One possible reaction to this powerlessness that Deleuze (and Guattari) alert us to is again the worst one, but this time instead of pushing all and everyone outside to maintain purity we push 'all the others toward the inside to such a degree that I kill them and myself. The worst occurs when there is total capture or no way out' (ibid.). What Lawlor calls for, and he finds tremendous resources for this move in Derrida, Deleuze (and Guattari), and Foucault, is a least violent response to the essential divisibility and porosity of limits. Thus, instead of prohibiting entry or escape, we instead become what Lawlor calls 'The friend of the outside' (39). This friend of the outside, as Lawlor elaborates, is not a friend of everyone we may happen to identify, everyone who may come and go. Rather one is a friend of the outside to the extent that they seek 'to find or write or speak the name that properly defines every single thing, the name that is proper to every singularity' (ibid.). In other words, the friend of the outside is one who finds a way to speak that does not fall into the worst violence in response to the 'contradictory forces' of the experience of the event.

In the second chapter, Lawlor lays the groundwork for Part II by transitioning from transcendental violence and the worst violence that attempts to eliminate the ineliminable, to the fundamental violence that characterizes the very nature of our experience of the event. Here the powerlessness of maintaining limits comes to be experienced as a battle, as a struggle; in short, as fundamental violence: 'the self-contact of the two forces [of singularizing and universalizing] is a struggle, and the distance between them is not a threshold . . . but a battlefield . . . we have entered into what we could call "fundamental violence"' (53). In two places, Lawlor clarifies this point by way of a soldier's experience of a battle (see 59 and 73-4). In the second instance, the mortally wounded soldier experiences more than his own wounding, his own awareness that he is 'going to die' (73); instead, the soldier move towards an experience that enables him to see above the chaos and randomness of the battlefield (with all the other multiplicity of experiences that it entails) and comes to a 'vison of life in its endless struggle with death' (ibid.). This 'experience of the battle,' Lawlor adds, 'is the event that forces us to think, and to think otherwise than how we have been thinking.' (74). Moreover, for Lawlor the emphasis is to be placed on the fact that it is a battle that forces us to think, and this not as an event among others, but as the event that does so. And yet this experience of the event brings with it, as Lawlor puts it, a 'fundamental shame [that] lies in the undecidability of the two forces at war in temporalization. Each force commands categorically and unconditionally: "Universalize!" "No, singularize!" "Singularize!" "No, universalize!" (81). This fundamental shame results, Lawlor argues, because 'to decide to obey one commandment necessarily implies the disobedience of the other. No matter how one decides, one will be inadequate to the task of stopping the violence . . . ' (ibid), and hence the shame at our powerlessness before the inevitability of violence.

A question seems to hang over this discussion -- one could suppose that this is inevitable given what Lawlor said regarding the powerlessness of maintaining limits, of keeping everything out or in. The question concerns what Lawlor calls the 'second type of question' which is about vigilance, which Lawlor claims 'goes like this: when deconstructive discourses adopt the imagery of violence, calling it "originary," "transcendental," or "foundational," is deconstructive discourse "vigilant" enough in regard to what we might call "real," "physical," or "historical" violence?' (89). One could add a further question: could the use of the language of violence, and the recognition of its ineliminable nature, become, unwittingly, complicit in a process that results in a quietism regarding the effects of real, historical violence? Lawlor is keen to address this question, among others. Recognizing that there is a difference between foundational violence and real, historical violence, he argues that the key point to stress is the need for even greater vigilance. As Lawlor says (several times), what is crucial is to adopt Deleuze's approach, as expressed in Logic of Sense, and maintain that 'The foundation can never resemble what it founds" (Deleuze, 1990, 99; cited 104). Consequently, we must not confuse the transcendental, fundamental discourse of violence with the fundamental violence as experienced, or even and more importantly the worst violence that seeks to eliminate the conditions that give rise to the violence and shame in the first place. Nevertheless, and despite the vigilance to the difference between the foundation and what it founds, the question remains as to whether there might not be a problematic relationship whereby the language of violence at the transcendental and foundational level bleeds into the language used in practice, in social and historical circumstances. Part II is in part an attempt to address such questions by further exploring the relationship between foundation and what is founded.

In Part II Foucault emerges as the pivotal figure, as one would expect given the importance of speaking out, or parrēsia, in Foucault's late work. Lawlor, however, argues that there is a continuity of concern in Foucault's work from his early work in the History of Madness, and in particular the role unreason plays in it, to his last lectures on speaking out. Lawlor thus holds to a 'continuity thesis: Foucault's thinking follows an unbroken path from unreason to parrēsia, his last great concept' (144). As Lawlor goes on to explain, 'both the discourse of delirium [i.e., unreason] and the speaking that speaks the truth frankly are intensifications of freedom' (145). In particular, these intensifications of freedom invoke a characteristic feature of becoming that Lawlor claims, in the early pages of Part II , 'no one has sufficiently recognized', namely that 'becoming is successful only if writing results' (117). In other words, an intensification of freedom would be, on this line of thinking, a successful becoming only if it avoids the repetition of the same, a falling into the traps and routines of custom, and if it avoids becoming lost in the chaos of unconnected singularities and random accidents. For becoming to become successful, something must stick, or something must come to be, and writing is the term used here by Lawlor (following Deleuze and Guattari) to refer to that which results from successful becoming.

Returning to Foucault, and to the intensification of freedom that occurs with parrēsia, what occurs in this way of speaking out, as well as in the other two ways of speaking that Lawlor discusses in Derrida and Deleuze -- speaking-distantly (Derrida) and speaking-in-tongues (glossolalia) [Deleuze and Guattari]) -- is that what one does with words by speaking is irreducible to established custom and tradition. It is for this reason that Lawlor turns, quite appropriately, to the importance of J.L. Austin's concept of the performative in the writings of Foucault, Derrida, and Deleuze (and Guattari). In the classic example of an Austin performative, when one says "I promise," she is thereby doing something, namely she is promising. Such promising, however, presupposes an already established consensus of what counts as promising or not. A couple in a stage play who swear oaths of marriage are not, in this circumstance, thought to have done something by stating these oaths -- they have not gotten married. What is unique to the ways of speaking we find in Foucault, Derrida, and Deleuze, by contrast, is that it both does something, like a performative, but does so without being solely accounted for in terms of the historical context or conditions that account for the success of Austin's performatives. What we do not have in Austin's performatives, which we do in Foucault's, Derrida's, and Deleuze's, is writing, or a successful becoming.

In the case of parrēsia, Lawlor notes that speaking freely to power does not produce, as is the case with Austin's performatives, an effect that is known; to the contrary, 'parrēsia,' Lawlor argues, 'opens the situation to effects that are not known,' and for this reason 'parrēsia is an "irruptive event"' (247). The person who speaks freely to power takes great risk, risking potential death if the person to whom she speaks does not like what she says. Yet this speaking freely has the potential to cause the hearer to think differently and hence to change the situation, or to result in the writing of successful becoming. In the case of speaking-distantly for Derrida, there is a similar process at work when you call to another -- on the one hand, it would seem that 'a consensus has already been established about the meanings and form of my words for there to be the beginning of understanding,' and yet when calling to another, for Derrida, 'I must minimally call to you about whether you understand what I'm saying' (255). In speaking-distantly, therefore, the way one speaks cannot be reduced, as with Austin's performatives, to established customs and consensus, and yet something is done. And finally, for Deleuze and Guattari, speaking-in-tongues brings into play a 'kind of sign that is neither simply repeatable nor simply material' (262). What one does in this way of speaking consists, as Lawlor puts it, of 'making your own language foreign . . . making your own language stutter' (ibid.). In other words, this way of speaking cannot be reduced to one's already spoken language, one's mother tongue, for it is making this language foreign, and yet, if successful, this way of speaking may provoke new ways of thinking, successful becomings that trace potentialities that may well circumvent and undermine current thinking and the real, historical violence this thinking legitimizes.

In closing we can see that Lawlor has shown that the ways of speaking that may result in a successful becoming are also reactions to a transcendental violence that do not attempt to eliminate all other ways of speaking that might not fit with the purity of one's native language, nor does it attempt to say everything, to include and capture all that can be said. These ways of speaking thus avoid the problem of the worst violence. On Lawlor's account, there is also no quietism with respect to violence, for speaking out against violence entails-- when using the three types of speaking he analyzes -- a speaking that allows for the potential to think differently, and in doing so to transform current manifestations of violence. There is no final violence-free zone to be had, but Lawlor has shown in this book how three of the more influential philosophers of the twentieth century have provided us with the resources to provoke a continual rethinking of the world and the violence this world entails.