Full History: On the Meaningfulness of Shared Action

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Steven G. Smith, Full History: On the Meaningfulness of Shared Action, Bloomsbury, 2017, 245pp., $91.99 (hbk), ISBN 9781474260336.

Reviewed by David Weberman, Central European University


In the mid-20th century, a distinction was made between two types of philosophy of history: i) analytical philosophy of history whose object of study is our knowledge of history and ii) substantive philosophy of history whose object is history itself in its most universal and fundamental features. The first type belongs to epistemology; the second, to metaphysics. Many philosophers at the time reasoned that such universal features, if there are any, can only be empirically ascertained and, consequently, that while the analytic project is legitimate, the substantive philosophical project is bogus. Nowadays such a strict division between the two seems questionable. This book is not clearly on either side of this demarcation line. It is does not focus, as much analytical philosophy of history does, on the writings and epistemic aims of professional historians. In fact, Smith deals at greatest length with authors such as Hegel, Sartre and Foucault. But its discussion is not metaphysical either since it concerns our reception of the historical past. It treats history as a field in which epistemological and metaphysical questions do not allow for easy unravelling. For Smith, history is not primarily a matter for scholars, but for the entire lot of us. His book sets its own agenda, not fitting easily into recent philosophical debates.

Smith's agenda is to make sense of and offer insights into various implications of what he calls "full history." He refers to himself as a "history maximalist." What is "history maximalism"? Smith says that it is not "strong historicism" according which the work of science, metaphysics and ethics is taken over by historians (p. ix). Yet it's unlikely that any philosopher embraces that position. What Smith's history maximalism seems to amount to is the view that everything in the past belongs to one single historically meaningful past. Now, if this is history maximalism, one wonders if there is anyone who would disagree with it. And if so, on what grounds? He doesn't make this sufficiently clear. Still, even if the thesis is uncontroversial, it might be underappreciated and worth unpacking. Smith's development of the idea seems to stress that all actions (even all events) depend on and impact all other actions. In this sense, as he formulates it, all actions are "shared." This truth entails that all our present actions are always shaped by the past and have an undeniably historical character.

Smith also has a lot to say about the responsibility which follows from the fact that our actions have consequences and must be seen as part of a larger whole. Everything hangs together in this way; so everything is fundamentally historical and makes a demand on us. Again, I am not sure that anyone would disagree with this kind of history maximalism. It is certainly true that we often forget just how much our lives are shaped by and continuous with the big historical picture. This might be especially true in countries such as the United States which has a mostly recently built environment, which has (fortunately) seen little of the destruction of war on domestic soil and which has offered so many immigrants a kind of escape from history. Perhaps we all need to be reminded of just how thoroughly historically embedded our present lives are. But I'm not sure that arguing for historical maximalism is philosophically necessary unless the grounds for possible opposition to the claim are made clearer. (Smith does argue that history is "real," not, as some have conceived it, "experiential" -- a point I return to below.)

The book's seven chapters deal with seven topics: meaningfulness, ontology, interest, importance, judgment, making history and the march of civilization.

In Chapter 1, Smith asks "what is historical meaningfulness?" He states that by "meaningfulness," he means "both a content of something meant and a power to compel consideration" (p.16). So, it appears to be a hybrid concept that attends to the fact that actions in history are typically undertaken with specific intentions in mind and that such actions are of interest to later generations. The two assumptions are reasonable but leave the main question somewhat directionless. The discussion proceeds by means of working out the idea of full history -- the idea that there is a whole story of what has happened, that is in principle at least knowable and that interests us because we -- who we are and what we do -- are very much connected to this past. Smith argues that this full story does not amount to a single "determinate totality of historical facts" because facts "must always be construed for one purpose among infinitely many." This last claim, unlike some of the other claims in the chapter, is controversial, but it does not receive careful elaboration and defense. Smith goes on to say that historical events are connected either by deriving them from one another (e.g., causally) or by "compounding" them (placing them in larger frameworks). He explains that our purpose with history might be historical, scientific, political, aesthetic, or speculative. His discussion reveals that his conception of meaningfulness comes down to what is interesting to us, or worthwhile for us to think about. Interests can be diverse but are always rooted in the fact that we share a world with the agents of past historical events, directly or indirectly. The chapter ends with a list of ways in which we can fail to engage with history adequately because we focus too one-sidedly on facts or grand theories or values or emotions.

Chapter 2 asks "how is history real?" or, as he also puts it, about "the ontological basis for taking history seriously." This question might lead in any number of directions. Smith launches into a discussion of two opposing views that he calls "archetypalism" and "experientialism." The former, exemplified by Plato, operates with eternal paradigms to which historical events conform. The latter, imputed by Smith, to numerous modern philosophers, is the view that "the very experiencing of things by the subject must be the touchstone of [historical] reality." Unfortunately, his definition of experientialism seems vague. Further, the two views don't seem exclusive since eternally recurrent patterns might be (or always are) experienced or known. At the end of the chapter, he criticizes experientialism because it ignores the practical implications of actions, but it is unclear to me why this is so. Other ontological and epistemological issues in this part of the chapter were not sufficiently well articulated. Rejecting both archetypalism and experientialism, Smith advocates the view that history is fundamentally about shared actions in a shared world. He provides a helpful four-pronged taxonomy of sharedness from minimal to maximal coordination and collaboration. Still, it seemed to me that his view answers a different question from the ones underlying the two views he rejects.

Chapter 3 asks "how is history interesting?" He distinguishes between two types of interestedness: being curious and having a stake in the matter. Being curiously engaged might just be a simple matter of something piquing our interest, but Smith argues that for something to be interesting in a historical manner, it must be a part of the past in a way that amounts to "a claim on the self-identification of active agents" (p.71) He distinguishes between the interest of a layperson, a historian and a philosopher of history. He also argues that these interests open us to three kinds of movements: from parts to whole and vice versa, and expanding the hitherto neglected segments of the past. He provides and discusses three examples of such expansions: natural history, feminist history and the history of sports.

Chapter 4's question "how does history matter?" seemed to me very close to the question of the previous chapter about how history interests us. Smith first deals with the notion of historical importance. His thoughts on importance make importance depend on seeing the connections between things and ultimately on finding a kind of unity in history. This leads him to discuss the question of whether history can and should be "totalized." Following others, he pits Foucault against Sartre, and ends up advocating, reasonably I believe, a position that attempts to allow some reconciliation between the two, recognizing an impulse to unity while allowing for contingencies and discontinuities.

Chapter 5 addresses the question "how is history understandable?", perhaps more clearly formulated by Smith as: "what kind of cognitive gains do we realize and how do these figure into our practical reckoning?" or, in my words, what do we learn from history and how does it bear on our present actions? For Smith, the cognitive gains are "insights" and "judgments." Insights are a "practically concerned 'seeing into' how action was shared as it was, recognizing the real possibilities of action sharing that were actualized and could mutatis mutandis, be shared again." To my mind, this means that insight concerns the specificity of what happened, its impact and implications. By "judgment", he means "a defensible determination of the whole practical meaning of that sharing of action." This is not immediately clear but the discussion shows that "judgment" concerns the lessons to be learned for the sake of future action. He distinguishes between essential and dynamic insights, the latter being about change, the former about constancy. Smith sees history as a field in which there is a practical continuum such that all actions meet up by means of our interest in making things better. He asks whether we can really form good historical judgments so that we can learn our lessons well. His examples of the difficulty in arriving at good historical judgments are well-chosen and interestingly discussed: the prophetic book of Jeremiah and Hannah Arendt on the Nazi Holocaust and the nature of evil. Smith concludes that good historical judgments are indeed possible.

The heading of Chapter 6 is "how can history be made?", but the chapter is more focused on how we can intend to make history in a manner that is reasonable and not self-defeating. His short answer is it that this involves the intention "to choose a course of action for the sake of the contribution it will make to an eventual retrospective meaningfulness of the outcome that will not be inconsistent with its projected meaningfulness." This means we intend to bring about an outcome that, at a future point, will not be at odds with what one originally intended. This seems true enough, as does the fact that there are typically other determinants of outcomes, such as considerable obstacles and unintended consequences. Smith concludes that we are able to act successfully despite all this. He deals with social movements, the difficulty in judging injustice in the light of changing moral codes, and returns to the issue of Sartre and totalization. He then discusses four modes of history making, corresponding to the four modes of sharedness from Chapter 2. He also takes into consideration the fact that humans share history with other non-human and even non-animal entities.

Chapter 7 asks: "how can history have an aim?" Here the question is not about a telos inherent in history independent of human will, but about "the longest term aim that would make the best sense of what we have done" (p. 177). This is an interesting twist on the question, not about what our aim is, but what aim (or aims) best accounts for our actions, retrospectively. Smith cites Thomas Jefferson's notion that the "march of civilization" was displayed geographically as a traveller moved from North America's Western frontier to the Atlantic seaboard. Many others, of course, have asked about "progress" in history. Scepticism is apt, says Smith, not so much because of the horrors of the 20th century, but because of our current over-urbanization and what we are "willing to destroy, abuse and ignore." Generally speaking, Smith says that we aim at the "Best Community," yet there is the worry that we might over-plan matters, thereby closing down possibilities. He identifies three types of meaningful historical aims: utopia, victory and salvation. By utopia, Smith means a state of society, that is desired, "ethical in its logic though not necessarily purely moral." On this point, Smith reminds us that utopian aims need to be grounded in real actions. His notion of victory was less clear to me. Victory is for Smith "encompass[ing] the whole object of practical understanding in a present-centred conception of history." By salvation, he means, "find[ing] an implied aim of history in construal of the past while holding focus on the meaningfulness of really shared action." (pp. 180-181). He suggests that salvation is a matter of extending, preserving or making the best of the past through action in the present so as to redeem the past for the future. Smith gives us some "points of reference" for a best world to which we might inspire, including such values as self-expression, strong relationships with others, more possibilities, less power-inequality, and what he calls "themes of fulfilment", namely, freedom, solidarity and redemption.

In a closing epilogue, he observes that while it is often easy to tell stories about past history, it is much more difficult to navigate the present and future by drawing on events of the past. Still, it is not impossible and it is our task to maintain and act on "a curious, responsible quest of full history."

Smith's Full History is an ambitious and original attempt to penetrate into the deep connections between the historical past, present and future. It draws on a considerable breadth of historical examples and is informed by reasonableness and balance. Still, I found its results limited, for the following reasons. First, the questions are not sharply formulated. Second, the answers or claims made are not always more sharply formulated than the questions. This is demonstrated by the fact that it is often unclear what an opposing answer might be. Third, some of the positions appear to be platitudinous. The book's main point is that we (everyone and everything) are all in this together and need to understand ourselves as belonging to a single realm extended over time. The book provides some insights into this phenomenon. It would have been made more worthwhile if the questions had been more precise and the opposing positions more clearly defined and explicated.