Functional Beauty

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Glenn Parsons and Allen Carlson, Functional Beauty, Oxford UP, 2008, 255pp., $70.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199205240.

Reviewed by Stephanie Ross, University of Missouri - St. Louis


In Functional Beauty, Glenn Parsons and Allen Carlson (henceforth P&C) attempt to revive the theory of functional beauty in order to explain our aesthetic responses. The first four chapters lay out the theoretical apparatus for their project, while the second four apply the theory to four cases: the appreciation of nature, of architecture, of the everyday, and of art. The authors begin by revisiting two cultural periods when the theory held sway -- ancient Greece, and 17th and 18th-century Britain. They offer quotes from thinkers as diverse as Socrates and David Hume attesting to the pleasure we take in the appearance of function. These opening snippets make clear that it is the appearance of function that pleases, as opposed to the actuality. Thus we are in the realm of the aesthetic.

P&C speculate that the decline of functional beauty was ushered in by the rise of disinterestedness (and that earlier thinkers who took perception to be non-cognitive foreshadowed this result). They present Jerome Stolnitz's version of disinterestedness, pointing out that Stolnitz's extreme approach prohibits appreciators from forming any concepts about the objects they admire. It follows that they cannot have any grasp of those objects' function. I suspect there are more modest approaches to disinterestedness, proposals modeled on what counts as bias in legal contexts rather than on strict demands for aconceptual encounters. Thus I'm not sure that disinterestedness deserves to be so vilified in the narrative that P&C present. Nonetheless, what matters is the present-day variant of functional beauty that they propose. They begin by returning to the basic idea of function.

P&C initially endorse an intentionalist account of function. They note that for both everyday and artistic examples, creators' intentions are generally key guides to our appreciation. This is less apt when it comes to nature appreciation. Intentionalism, however, proves inadequate even in those friendlier realms. P&C offer some telling examples to show that intention is never sufficient to determine function, as objects can always be put to new and unintended uses. Thus the relativism that travels with functional theories provides a serious challenge. They return repeatedly to the example of Plaza Major, an urban space in Madrid that originally functioned as a royal courtyard but now houses all manner of civic events. Contemplating our penchant for using shovels as doorstops and beer as slug poison, the authors suggest that a theory of functional beauty needs to track not just any old function, but the proper function of the object of appreciation (p. 78).

The authors believe their theory must meet two important challenges: the translation problem and the indeterminacy problem. The first asks how knowledge of function can transform our perceptual/aesthetic experience; the second asks about criteria of correctness. I find the Quinean echoes of these labels a bit distracting here. Perhaps they're meant to encourage us to see the overall project as one that naturalizes some core notions. In any case, the authors purport to solve the problem of indeterminacy in chapter 3 and the problem of translation in chapter 4. Overall, they seek a theory that will deliver both completeness and unity -- that is, it must apply not only to our aesthetic judgments about works of art, but also to our aesthetic judgments about nature and the everyday. Similar accounts must apply in each case. In order to build a univocal theory, they travel first to the realm of science, then fit their borrowings to the cultural sphere.

Seeking a notion of proper function that captures "our tacit recognition that some functions 'belong' to the object itself in a way that others do not", the authors turn to recent work by philosophers of science who have sought to naturalize function (p. 66). The resulting accounts are entirely causal and non-intentional. P&C find particularly promising the so-called selected effects theories of function. These identify proper function as features or traits that enhance fitness in their possessors, thereby leading to reproduction of the genotype for that trait (p. 72). The authors maintain that such explanations can distinguish between what strike us as proper functions -- e.g., that the heart pumps blood -- and mere chance correlations -- e.g., that the heart makes noise.

The next task for P&C is to extend this selected effects approach beyond the biological realm so that it also applies to artifacts that compel our appreciation, among them works of art and everyday objects. They propose that in such cases, what generates proper function is success in meeting marketplace wants or needs. When an artifact displays a function that pleases the public, then more such items are produced. Modeling their theory on Beth Preston's insight that "In the cultural milieu, [the] history of reproduction contingent upon success shows up as a history of manufacture and distribution by trade or sale", the authors come up with the following definition of artifactual function:[1]

X has a proper function F if and only if Xs currently exist because, in the recent past, ancestors of X were successful in meeting some need or want in the marketplace because they performed F, leading to the manufacture and distribution of Xs (p. 75).

Since an object's ancestors ensure its success, the analogy with the biological case seems apt. Nevertheless, in extending their theory to non-living things, P&C encounter what I think of as the 'ur' problem. How can we recognize the functional beauty of entirely new or revolutionary artifacts, given that these have no predecessors on which the market version of natural selection could have operated? On the one hand, the extreme version of this predicament can be dismissed. An item so new and distinct as to bear no ties to anything that has come before is probably something we're incapable of appreciating; it is also something unlikely to exist, since we can find similarities linking almost any two items chosen at random. On the other hand, P&C speculate that our intuitions about proper function are poorly grounded when we address radically innovative items. They offer up this thought experiment -- a revolutionary new, electromagnetic can opener that turns out, unexpectedly, to cure cancer -- and suggest we'd soon view curative power as its primary and most important function (p. 84).

P&C face a more troubling problem as they continue to address the complications that confront their theory. Towards the end of chapter 4, they present a taxonomy of functional beauty, suggesting that there is not only the sort of beauty (1) that tracks the appearance of fitness, but also the sort (2) that stems from traits like simplicity, gracefulness, and elegance, that flag the efficient achievement of a given end (p. 96; these traits are also ascribed to scientific theories and proofs by those who find room for the aesthetic in such realms), and (3) that items that display a "pleasing dissonance" in their sensory elements possess (p. 99). P&C explain these two additional categories by reference to Kendall Walton's important and influential paper "Categories of Art". The second type of functional beauty occurs when an object has few contra-standard or variable features, while the third type results from the lack of at least some standard features and the presence of contra-standard ones. P&C's example of type 3 functional beauty is the delicacy of an industrial crane (p. 99)! While these borrowings from Walton allow the authors to craft a cognitively rich theory of aesthetic appreciation and to make headway in solving the problem of translation (since Walton's theory purports to show how our aesthetic experience changes when we view an object in changing categories), they also threaten to make functional beauty ubiquitous. If the absence of contra-standard properties generates type 2 functional beauty, while the presence of such properties is a hallmark of type 3 functional beauty, then these two claims together with the Law of the Excluded Middle threaten to establish that we're always in the presence of functional beauty. Of course, I don't accept this conclusion. Nevertheless, my proposed reductio suggests the authors owe us more substantive accounts of the varieties of functional beauty they posit.

In their closing chapters, P&C survey the role of functional beauty in four different realms. Beginning with the natural environment, they distinguish between the beauty of organic and of inorganic features. With regard to animals, they spend some time worrying about what they call the Immorality Objection. This is drawn from feminist complaints about objectification. Calling attention to a woman's appearance threatens to overshadow or deny her other valued traits. The authors characterize this as an error that seizes on surface qualities while ignoring depth. This may well characterize the plaints of (Western) women in the 20th and 21st centuries, but I'm not at all convinced that it extends plausibly to, say, cheetahs (the example discussed on p. 120). What depths are we ignoring when we focus on and appreciate the aspects of a cheetah's build that indicate and outwardly express its fleetness? On the other hand, what adaptive traits of toads, manatees, bottom-dwelling oddly-camouflaged fish, and other 'unattractive' creatures do we overlook when we fail to deem them beautiful?

P&C propose distinct accounts of functional beauty for organic and inorganic nature. While selection in the original evolutionary sense applies to the former, function is glossed as causal role for the latter. This, however, threatens to fracture the unity the authors pledged to provide in their account. Moreover, the examples proposed for functional beauty of ecosystems aren't always persuasive. We are asked to believe that algae-filled swamps and flooded riverbanks seem less chaotic once we know the causal role each plays in watershed drainage and the like (e.g., p. 127).

When they shift to architecture -- functional beauty in the built environment -- P&C spend considerable time discussing the famous modernist norm that form follows function. They worry that this, too, betrays allegiance to shallow surface features at the expense of more worthy but less accessible traits (the feminist plaint transferred to a new realm). Perhaps the most interesting portion of this chapter is the discussion of the aesthetics of ruins, since these threaten to provide a pithy counter-example to any equation of function and beauty. After all, what is ruin but the devolution of previous function? To explain away this case, the authors postulate that the expressivity of ruins -- their cultural association with all manner of carpe diem themes -- trumps their apparent dysfunction (pp. 164-5).

Dysfunction is in fact a challenge the authors face repeatedly in the applied sections of their book. Purportedly a book about functional beauty, the work must also explain our negative aesthetic reactions triggered by the lack of apparent fitness. To establish that such cases are indeed in the realm of the aesthetic, P&C discuss examples where a disabled or nonfunctional object is further damaged (p. 108). Suppose we take a tire iron and smash the window of a car that already has 4 flat tires. The authors would argue that the additional distress this action produces cannot be attributed to function per se, since the vehicle was already undrivable. They conclude that our additional discomfort is therefore aesthetic in origin. In their preface, P&C note that their topic is in fact broader than the title of the book might indicate. They are pursuing not simply functional beauty, but "aesthetic appreciation involving knowledge that concerns function" (p. xii). They opted not to use this more accurate phrase because it is so awkward and unmellifluous! Nonetheless, it is helpful to keep in mind the broader target of their investigation.

In their chapter on everyday aesthetics, the authors argue against a Deweyan approach that would embrace bodily pleasures associated with the proximal senses. Instead, they propose that for everyday objects, the notion of proper function yields a matrix of conventions and norms akin to the one that functions in the artworld and with the help of which we can form cognitively rich aesthetic judgments (p. 190). Turning to works of art, P&C indicate the many competing theories that have been proposed regarding art's function. They claim that in this realm, only a selected effects theory can capture art's proper function: "that effect of art that, in the recent past has caused it to be manufactured, distributed, or maintained in existence" (p. 216). In the end, they endorse a pluralist solution that situates artworks in various functional categories. The approach works well for the examples discussed -- tragedy and religious art -- though it might not do so well in explaining precisely what it is about, say, novels and symphonies that caused their continuing creation and distribution.

Functional Beauty is eminently readable, and the authors display a convincing mastery of the scientific literature from which they borrow. I have mentioned in passing aspects of their project about which I have reservations. In the end, however, I believe that the authors' theory stands or falls with their proposal that marketplace selection -- selection in the market for cultural products -- parallels natural selection. This is an attention-getting and attractive analogy. I worry, however, that when challenged to specify market forces more fully, defenders of this theory will face problems very similar to those that confronted champions of the institutional theory as they tried to delimit first, an institution, and then, a more informal practice, that structured the artworld. No matter how this challenge plays out, however, P&C have done much to advance the debate about aesthetic appreciation in all realms. Their book is a must-read for serious philosophers of art.

[1] Beth Preston, "Why is a Wing like a Spoon? A Pluralist Theory of Function", Journal of Philosophy 115, p. 244.