Functions and Generality of Logic: Reflections on Dedekind's and Frege's Logicisms

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Hourya Benis-Sinaceur, Marco Panza, and Gabriel Sandu, Functions and Generality of Logic: Reflections on Dedekind's and Frege's Logicisms, Springer, 2015, 125pp., $54.99 (hbk), ISBN 9783319171081.

Reviewed by Roy T. Cook, University of Minnesota


There is no other way to begin a review of Functions and Generality of Logic than to note that it is, structurally, a very strange little book. It is formatted as a single volume with multiple authors. But it is, in fact, a hybrid of sorts -- lying somewhere between a single-topic monograph written by three authors and an anthology edited by those same individuals. As Hourya Benis-Sinaceur, Marco Panza, and Gabriel Sandu note in the preface (p. v-vi), the book really consists of three essays that were written independently by the three authors respectively. Thus,the book is as much an edited volume, where the editors oddly decided to include only themselves, as it is a traditional monograph.

This is not really a criticism so much as an observation regarding the slight strangeness of the volume, since the individual essays collected here are excellent. Two of the essays (Panza's and Sandu's) address aspects of Gottlob Frege's logicism, and the other essay (Benis-Sinaceur's), although explicitly an examination of Richard Dedekind's logicistic tendencies, naturally involves a careful compare-and-contrast between Dedekind's foundational work and Frege's (although we need to be careful here since Benis-Sinaceur's main point is a criticism of the manner in which this Dedekind-against-Frege sort of comparison is usually carried out!) Thus, although the volume will and should be of interest to anyone working on the history of philosophy of mathematics and logic, it will be especially useful to those engaging with the exciting 'new wave' of Frege scholarship that has come about via the recent translation of Frege's magnum opus -- Grundgesetze der Arithmetik (2013).

In addition to these thematic connections between the three main chapters, there is also a structural connection. Each of the essays examines the work of either Dedekind or Frege by drawing novel contrasts or connections between that individual and one or more other philosophers or tightly connected group of philosophers. As already mentioned, Benis-Sinaceur's essay uses Frege as a background against which to examine whether, and to what extent, Dedekind is a logicist. Panza situates Frege within a mathematical tradition beginning roughly with Lagrange in order to ask whether Frege accepted the modern notion of arbitrary extensional function. And Sandu, asking a similar question, looks forwards instead of back, connecting Frege's conception of function to the later views of Bertrand Russell and Frank Ramsey.

In more detail: in the first chapter ("Is Dedekind a Logicist? Why Does Such a Question Arise?") Benis-Sinaceur examines Dedekind's supposed logicism -- that is, the claim that he attempted to reduce mathematics (or, at least, arithmetic and real and complex analysis) to logic in roughly the same sense that Frege did. The idea that Dedekind and Frege were engaged in the same or similar projects is not absurd, if only because Dedekind describes Frege's work favorably as having close connections to his own (and Frege similar endorses Dedekind's project). In addition, as Benis-Sinaceur points out, influential twentieth century historians of analytic philosophy such as Philip Kitcher, Howard Stein, William W. Tait, William Demopoulos, and others have described Dedekind as an early contributor to the logicist programme. But, as these same scholars have pointed out, if Dedekind is engaged in the same project as Frege, then his contributions to this project are, in the end, far less successful and substantial than Frege's. Bluntly put: if Dedekind's foundational work is judged by the criteria of the Fregean logicist project, then Dedekind is at best a failed logicist.

Benis-Sinaceur argues, however, that such an assessment of Dedekind's work is both inaccurate and interferes with appreciation of Dedekind's important, albeit non-logicist, contributions to the foundations of mathematics. According to Benis-Sinaceur, although Dedekind did attempt to reduce arithmetic and analysis to logic, he mobilized a very different understanding of logic:

one cannot give to 'logic' and 'logical, under Dedekind's pen, the same meaning as these words have for Frege. In particular Dedekind's logic has to do neither with analysis of language, nor with a theory of inference, nor with a theory of truth. So if one persist in taking à la lettre Dedekind's claim that arithmetic is a part of logic, one should make precise that the building tools he uses to substantiate this claim, viz., the notion of a System and an Abbildung, together with that of inclusion, are not logical in Frege's sense of the word. (p. 56)

Thus, Dedekind's notion of logic is, in the end, more purely epistemological than Frege's, on Benis-Sinaceur's reading: Dedekind is not interested in showing that particular mathematical theories are reducible to purely logical formalisms or ontologies but instead aims to show how mathematical thinking and mathematical knowledge are of the same kind as logical thinking and knowledge.

Panza's chapter ("From Lagrange to Frege: Functions and Expressions") begins the two-part examination of Frege's understanding of and utilization of functions by locating him at the end of a historical tradition that begins with the traditional idea that a function is a particular kind of linguistic expression -- an equation, loosely put. From this beginning we move to Lagrange's transformation of functions from operations that are applied to quantities to their being genuine quantities that can be operated on. From here the investigation proceeds to Weierstrauss, Riemann, and the nineteenth century arithmetization of analysis (a phenomenon that no doubt had a profound effect on Frege's thinking) and ends with Frege's utilization of functions in Grundgesetze. Panza's main goal throughout this historical reconstruction is to critique extant arguments (e.g. Tappenden 2006) for the claim that Frege accepted the modern notion of function as both arbitrary and extensional within his philosophy and formal work in Grundgesetze.

One of the main ingredients of the story Panza tells begins with Frege's notorious claim that phrases such as "the function F" refer, not to a function, but to some sort of object-level correlate of functions. Panza rejects the simple interpretation where such phrases refer to the value-range of the function in question, instead opting for a slightly vaguer suggestion that the referents of these phrases are identical to, or intimately connected to, the procedures associating arguments to outputs underlying each such function:

these objects [referents of phrases of the form "the function F"] should somehow reflect the distinctive features of these rules or procedures (i.e. the differences among them), even when they connect the same objects to the same other objects and result then in the same value-ranges. (p. 87)

This account is then intimately tied to Panza's explication of Frege's ontology of functions: Consider two extensionally equivalent functions F1 and F2. Must F1 and F2 be identical? If "the function F1" refers to the value-range of F1 and "the function F2" refers to the value-range of F2, then yes, since the extensional equivalence of the functions in entails, via Basic Law V, that their value ranges are identical, and hence:

The function F1 is the same as the function F2.

is true. If, however, the "special objects" referred to by phrases of the form "the function F" do not refer to value-ranges, but to something akin to such procedures, then the offset phrase above would turn out false (since procedures are not individuated extensionally, on Panza's reading of Frege). As a result, Frege's understanding of function is not extensional since functions are, on Panza's reading, intimately tied to the procedures to which they correspond.

Sandu, in the final chapter ("Frege, Russell, Ramsey and the Notion of an Arbitrary Function"), attacks roughly the same issue, but from a very different direction. Sandu compares Frege's account of the nature of functions to two accounts that followed and that were no doubt deeply influenced by Frege's work: Ramsey's account of predicative functions and Russell's account of propositional function. Sandu concludes that Russell's treatment of functions retained a non-extensional aspect found in its Fregean precursor, but not found in Ramsey's work:

What Frege and Russell ignored and Ramsey realized, is that one can and needs to talk about a function even when one is not able to individuate it through the law that generates [it], like for instance when one talks about the properties all functions have . . . This provides an extensionalist notion of a function, akin in spirit to Ramsey's notion of a function in extension, which anticipates its treatment in contemporary mathematics: a notion that stands opposite both to Frege's conception, according to which a function is constrained by a law, and to Russell's idea of a propositional function. (p. 116)

The argument is complicated, involving detailed discussions not only of Ramsey's and Russell's formal work, but objections to that work raised by Wittgenstein and others. The only real flaw in this chapter -- if one can call it that -- is that the essay seems to be primarily concerned with Ramsey and Russell rather than with Frege: over half the chapter (pp. 104-114) is devoted to carefully explicating the technical details of Ramsey's views with almost no mention of Frege.

The connections between the issues addressed in these three chapters are deep and important, and the authors attempt to makes these connections -- and hence the reason for these three essays appearing as parts of a single, multiply-authored book in the first place -- even more apparent in a lengthy co-written introduction. This introduction, unfortunately, although useful for drawing links between their individual essays, is nevertheless the weakest portion of the book. This is not to say that it is bad, but there are moments of sloppiness in its presentation of the views of Frege, Dedekind, and more recent philosophers of mathematics that could have been easily avoided with a bit more care. For example, when introducing Frege's methods for reconstructing the ontology of mathematics via value-ranges, and the role that abstraction principles such as Hume's Principle play in such reconstructions, the authors write that:

Frege's infamous Basic Law V provides such a non-explicit definition: it implicitly defines value-ranges by stating an identity condition for value-ranges of first-level one-argument functions, that is, by asserting, as it is well-known, that the value-range of a first-level one-argument function Φ(ζ) is the same as that of a first-level one-argument function Ψ(ζ) if and only if the value-range of Φ(ζ) is the same as that of Ψ(ζ) for whatever argument. (p. xi)

Now, Basic Law V does provide identity conditions for value-ranges of first-level functions. But it does not do so in virtue of being a definition either of value-ranges themselves or of the concept Value-range. Frege rejected Basic Law V as a definition of value-ranges for exactly the same reasons that he rejected Hume's Principle as a definition of cardinal numbers: neither can be definitions since both fall prey to, among other things, the Caesar Problem (note that Hume's Principle is also a law of logic within Grundgesetze -- albeit not a basic one -- but is clearly no definition!). Basic Law V is thus not a definition, but a Basic Law (i.e. a primitive logical law of the extended begriffschrift as formulated in Grundgesetze) -- it is merely a truth of logic governing the 'behavior' of value-ranges (and their identity conditions in particular).

The authors also slip up in their description of the ongoing project in the philosophy and foundations of mathematics most closely connected to Frege's project -- neo-logicism -- when they write that:

We know today that an alternative route for arithmetical logicism -- allegedly understood, if not in the same way, at least in a way close to Frege's -- has been suggested . . . Still, it is clear that this route also depends on the admission of a basic function, namely the cardinal number function, which, while taken to be a logical function, is required to have as its possible values some objects whose existence is not a necessary condition for the admissibility of the relevant system of logic. (p. xii)

This, again, gets things exactly wrong. It has never been a part of Crispin Wright/Bob Hale-style neo-logicism that the cardinal number function -- that is, the second-level function mapping concepts to their cardinal numbers and governed by Hume's Principle -- be viewed as a logical function (nor has it ever been claimed that Hume's Principle itself is a logical truth). While the exact characterization of the special status of Hume's Principle and the function it provides has evolved over the last 30+ years (e.g. implicit definition, analytic truth, epistemically innocent, etc.), neo-logicists have always rejected the claim that it is a logical truth for much the same reasons that Benis-Sinaceur, Panza, and Sandu raise: it has ontological consequences that seem incompatible with current views on the status and role of logic (even if these consequences were not incompatible with Frege's views on these matters).

Slip-ups like this are worrisome and worth correcting, but fortunately they don't pop up very often-- especially in the three main chapters. Benis-Sinaceur, Panza, and Sandu argue for many claims regarding Frege's and Dedekind's views, historical roles, and influences that many readers are likely to disagree with, but these are almost always (and unlike the two examples from the introduction) instances where what they have said is controversial and a matter of subtle interpretation, not places where it looks like they just got something wrong. Their positions on many of the important issues in Frege and Dedekind scholarship are not always the mainstream ones (and it is worth noting that they don't always agree with each other, although they do so more often than they don't), but where they take an unpopular stance on Frege or Dedekind they invariably support it with novel and interesting arguments and evidence. This is the sort of disagreement between author(s) and reader that should be desired: I personally disagreed with all three authors more than I agreed with them, but I learned a lot about Frege, and about subtle consequences of my own views on various matters of Frege scholarship, along the way.

In sum, these three essays are important contributions to our understanding of Frege, Dedekind, and the larger intellectual environment within which they worked. All three could probably have been developed further into short books of their own, and I sometimes found myself wishing that they had. But commenting on merely possible works that don't exist isn't really a criticism of the work that does, especially when the work in question is this good.


Frege, G. (2013), The Basic Laws of Arithmetic, Ebert, P. and M Rossberg (trans. and eds.), Oxford University Press.

Tappenden, J. (2006) "The Riemannian Background to Frege's Philosophy", in The Architecture of Modern Mathematics: Essays in History and Philosophy, J. Ferreirós and J. J. Gray (eds.), Oxford University Press: 97-132.