Functions: New Essays in Philosophy of Psychology and Biology

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Ariew, Andrew; Cummins, Robert; Perlman, Mark (eds.), Functions: New Essays in Philosophy of Psychology and Biology, Oxford University Press, 2002, 464pp, $24.95 (pbk), ISBN 0199255814.

Reviewed by Graham MacDonald, University of Canterbury


This volume of new essays explores the variety of ways in which functions and functional explanations have been viewed in recent debates in philosophy of mind/psychology and philosophy of biology. The volume is divided into four sections: history of teleology and functional explanation (Ariew, Ruse), functional explanation today (Boorse, Millikan, Hardcastle, Cummins, Wimsatt, Buller, Schwartz), teleosemantics (Perlman, Enc, Walsh), and methodological issues (Matthen, Allen, and Neander). In the space available it is impossible to comment appropriately on all these papers, so I will be selective, the selection perhaps reflecting my interests in differing accounts of functionality and teleosemantics rather than the quality of the papers. I have not had space to discuss the interesting contributions of Wimsatt, Schwartz (both in the section on functional explanation), Matthen (on whether the function of rationality is to lead us to true beliefs), and Allen (on different characterisations of biological traits).

The historical section contains an interesting overview of the history of teleological explanations from Plato to Darwin by Ariew, and a rather more rambling essay by Ruse. The second section contains confrontations between various analyses and accounts of what being a function amounts to, and consequently about the nature of functional explanation. Boorse heroically defends the Nagel-Boorse goal-directed approach. Basically this account has it that a function is something which contributes to the goal of that which contains it. The chief objections relate to the resulting non-explanatoriness of attributions of function, and, relatedly, to the choice of the goal. The severance from any explanatory task raises the question of what work the attribution of function is doing; on this account one could replace any such attribution by simply citing a cause which has a certain effect (contributing to a stipulated ’goal’), and nothing would be lost. As to unperformed functions, Boorse says that the function of the normal heart is to pump blood round the body, but in a case in which it doesn’t, that token doesn’t have that function, since that token is not normal. To think otherwise, suggests Boorse, is to confuse normal function in a type with actual function in a token. A consequence of not allowing type-function to dictate token function is that there can be no malfunctioning heart, for example, since all such malfunction will signal lack of normality. Boorse bites this bullet, but others may well think that this is a defect in the goal-directed account.

Specifying a goal comes down to accepting that life “just is a natural kind of goal-directedness” (p. 76). For organisms the many specific goal-directed ’behaviours’, such as flying, running, eating, are sub-tasks in the pursuit of an ’apical’ goal, that of survival and reproduction of the organism: any property whose instancing contributes to the fitness (thus defined) of the organism thereby performs a function – no matter how that property came to play this role for the organism. This would have it that if I chase a fly into the next room, thereby escaping from the truck that crashes into the room just vacated, the fly has performed the function (has the function on this occasion?) of getting me into the next room, thus aiding my survival. We may talk in this loose way, but an account of functions which grounds their attribution in something more solid is to be preferred.

Etiological accounts try to perform this grounding task by focusing on the role of natural selection. One rationale for doing this is that with designed objects we can attribute function via the purpose for which they were designed. Since Darwin, natural selection has played the role of designer, without our own interests or intentions getting into the picture. Valerie Hardcastle thinks that natural selection cannot play this de-anthropomorphised grounding role, because any theory which cites natural selection as the producer of functional traits just reflects our own interest in natural selection. This doesn’t do justice to those views; natural selection is emphasised because it results in the spread of the trait in the population. The neo-teleologists, to use Robert Cummins apt name for those who support the selectionist strategy, claim the following explanatory gain: because (some) effects of ancestors of an instance of a trait helped cause a proliferation of instances of the trait, that type of effect is cited as contributing to an explanation of the existence of this instance, and so as the function of this trait.

It is precisely this supposed connection between selection and function that is disputed by Robert Cummins. The problem as he sees it is that selection works on micro-features of traits, whereas functions are properties of the traits themselves. We unproblematically say that the function (or a function) of the wings of a bird is to facilitate flight. If the selectionist story of the grounds of this function-attribution were right, then wings would have been selected for that effect (facilitating flight), which means that in the reproduction stakes winged birds had the edge on wingless birds. Cummins argues that this cannot be how the selectionist story goes; it is inconceivable that the struggle for survival was one between the wingless and the winged. Rather, amongst the winged birds, those variants with more efficient wings were selected. Or something like that. The same goes for any complex feature of an organism: it is small changes in already present structures that are relevant to how selection operates. As a consequence, function and selection come apart, and neo-teleology’s selection-dependent grounding of function is wrong. Another way of separating function from selection, Cummins notes, is to take cognisance of the fact that every trait of a ’winning’ organism will spread, regardless of whether that trait contributes to the winning, so one cannot even say that the spread of a trait entails its adaptiveness or functionality. And adaptiveness is a matter of degree; of two traits which perform the same function one may perform it better than another, so be more adaptive, and thus selected (ceteris paribus). A response to this would be to recognise micro-selection, but to note that functions can be variously described, from the very immediate to the more ultimate, and that the micro-changes on which selection operates provide the resulting traits with proximate functions which improve the operation of the more distal function.

Cummins claims that it is not having a function that drives selection, but functioning better. One variation of wing design may be ’better’ – more energy efficient, say - without improving the flight-function of the wing. Once one has decoupled functional attribution from selection and adaptiveness one can then ’ground’ such attributions in functional analyses of complex systems. Is this a ’natural’ enough grounding? Cummins replies that the naturalising problem was that of grounding teleology naturally; once function is stripped of any teleological connotation (as it is in functional analysis) then there is no problem left, or at least not one which requires the naturalistic solution provided by neo-teleologists. Functions turn out to be simply a sub-class of (natural) dispositions. However this anti-teleological account now faces the problem of saying why the notion of function is employed at all – why not settle for ’dispositional analysis’? The suspicion is that it is because these analyses are of complex systems, and because such complex systems look designed, or that the coordinated workings of their parts looks purposeful, that the notion of function seems particularly appropriate.

David Buller is also concerned to distinguish between functions and a history of selection whilst defending an historical account of functionality. He does this by distinguishing weak from strong etiological theories of function. The strong theory has it that a present token of a trait in an organism has a function iff previous tokens contributed to the fitness of ancestors of the organism and were selected for because of this contribution to fitness; the weak theory just eliminates the clause about selection and adds that the fitness enhancing effect of past tokens thereby contributed to the reproduction of descendants of those organisms with the relevant trait. One may wonder why it is that the weak account still needs to be etiological, given the excision of any reference to selection. Given the take on fitness being independent of selection, the addition of the clause about (relevant) past exercises of the trait contributing to the reproduction of organisms possessing that trait appears redundant. Buller’s response is to note that any token of a trait has numerous effects, so one has to single out those which contribute to the fitness of the organism, and this can only be done historically. This looks to be an epistemological rather than definitional concern.

Ruth Millikan defends her theory of proper function, compares it to Cummins’ (causal role) account, and provides conceptual space for the notion of exaptation to do some work. Her theory, first elaborated in her Language, Thought, and Other Biological Categories, is the most sophisticated etiological account available, providing for a many layered classification of different types of functions. Here she reprises that account, simplifying it somewhat and discussing further the role of derived and adapted functions. She claims that tying functionality to selection does not have the damaging consequences Cummins alleges it does. In particular she insists that the (historical) reproductive advantage (arising from a genetic change) accruing to some members of a species will mean that some (non-advantaged) members of that species will not survive, even where this change may have just the result that some trait turns out to work more efficiently.

Millikan proceeds to outline four problems (“leaks”) in the notion of a Cummins’ function where this notion is used as a characterisation of a bio-function: establishing relevant counterfactuals to the actual properties and behaviour of animals, dividing the complex causal path leading to reproduction into functional/non-functional causes, discriminating between various environmental inputs as to those to which the animal is adapted and those which are used by the animal but are only accidentally advantageous, and last, how to make sense of the system’s ’repair’ mechanisms, where these operate to restore the organism to proper working order after, say, a destructive blow. The problem here is that the blow may not be part of the recognised or permitted input to any part of the system, so is not included within the scope of a Cummins’ style functional analysis, or not easily so included. And if it isn’t, then the ’proper’ response to it will not be included either. The criticism is that this will lead to the exclusion of a considerable number of the bio-functions of an organism. The conclusion is not that Cummins’ functions are useless as an account of bio-functions, but that the interesting Cummins’ functions will be those which are adaptations. Implicitly the suggestion is that the leaks can be fixed by paying attention to the selection processes which (ultimately) produce the complex systems.

The section on teleosemantics has an article by Mark Perlman in which he argues that the main teleosemantic theories (advanced by Dretske, Millikan, and Papineau) cannot do what they set out to do: provide an account of content which allows for misrepresentation. In this he is pursuing a line of attack pursued elsewhere against Millikan by Cummins and Godfrey-Smith, both of whom see the teleosemantic approach as bedeviled by the problem of any ’use’ theory of meaning – distinguishing ’proper’ from ’improper’ uses in a non-question-begging way. In broadening the criticism to other ’teleosemanticists’, Perlman runs together some very different approaches. For example, Millikan, in her account of intentionality, uses the notion of ’mapping rules’ as an essential building block, and the notion of misrepresentation is cashed out in terms of, say, a linguistic device’s failing to map onto its proper target. Neither Papineau nor Dretske use mapping rules as foundational in this way, so it would be surprising if the same criticism could cover all three.

Teleosemanticists have also been criticised for assuming more determinacy in the ascription of functions than they are entitled to. Berent Enc argues that the assumption that there is a unique, determinate function performed by detection systems is false, so function-talk does not allow for the level of determinacy required by propositional attitudes, but that this indeterminacy is untroubling for the ascription of content to sub-doxastic states. Denis Walsh sees indeterminacy as a problem for the attribution of some functions, but not necessarily those connected to intentional content. He discusses what he sees as three reductive moves made by teleosemantic theorists: intentional content to intentional function, intentional function to evolutionary function, and evolutionary function to causal (selectionist) history. Walsh attacks the second and third phases of this reductionist strategy, but thinks that this leaves defensible a naturalistic reduction of intentional content to intentional function. It is precisely because teleosemanticists have misconstrued the nature of biological teleology that one can still defend a (weak) reductive strategy which sees intentional content explained by intentional function. He thinks that the indeterminacy problems faced by teleosemanticists arise only because these theorists misunderstand the role of function ascriptions in evolutionary biology. He alludes to an article by Amundson and Lauder, who have argued that most biologists attribute functions to traits in order to explain “how their effects contribute to the adaptively significant activities of the system of which they are a part” (p.322). Given this explanatory aim, determinacy is unnecessary. And as far as biological classification goes, Walsh claims, this is determined more by homology than function. He also argues that a mapping rule for any environmental condition, p, would have to be useful to the agent’s purposes given any combination of the agent’s beliefs and desires, and he thinks this is a tall order for any mapping rule. But why he thinks this has to be true for any such rule to be selected is not clear; he seems to think that the rule would have to guarantee successful fulfillment of any of the agent’s psychological purposes, which is clearly too much to ask of any rule, but it is debatable whether the teleosemanticist needs such a strong requirement. Walsh’s own view relies on the claim that it has been shown that adaptations arise naturally as a consequence of the dynamics of complex systems, and can do this without selection. This is speculative: how much “spontaneous order” there is is a matter of some debate. It is much more debatable whether intentionality arises from such spontaneous ordering.

Neander (in the section on methodological issues) attacks the claim that homology determines classification, with functional categorisation reserved for analogous traits (traits that have evolved independently and serve the same function, such as bird wings and insect wings). She argues, convincingly, that the notion of function plays an important role in homologous classification as well, so its importance for biological classification is not restricted to the (relatively) unimportant analogous categories.

As can be seen from the above, Functions is a richly varied collection of essays which, despite the variety, provides the reader with the opportunity for a sustained examination of the central issues concerning functions and their role in biology and psychology.