Functions: Selection and Mechanisms

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Philippe Huneman (ed.), Functions: Selection and Mechanisms, Springer, 2013, 243pp., $129.00 (hbk), ISBN 9789400753037.

Reviewed by Paul Sheldon Davies, College of William and Mary


Philippe Huneman asserts that since the 1970s theories of functions have been framed in terms of two claims:

(a)   Functions are generally implemented in mechanisms.

(b)  Functional explanations in biology have an essential relation with natural selection. (p. 2; italics added)

These claims roughly correspond to the two theories that have dominated the debate ever since: the systemic capacity theory of Robert Cummins and the etiological theory of Larry Wright. Advocates of Cummins' theory have emphasized (a), advocates of Wright's have emphasized (b). Still others, the pluralists, have insisted that both theories are required, since each serves theoretical needs the other cannot serve.

So why, some 40 years later, a book-length collection on the relative merits of (a) and (b)? What purposes are served? Huneman gives two answers:

(1)  There have been theoretical advances since the 1990s in various disciplines that "must in the end affect the traditional theories of function, even in their most sophisticated form." (p. 6)

(2)  No one has produced a theory that adequately solves the "issues around functions". (p. 3)

My aim in this review is to indicate why I regard (2) as false and (1) as probably false but certainly overstated even if true.

Regarding (2), I simply beg to differ (see below). Regarding (1), while there have indeed been theoretical developments related to function ascriptions -- Andreas Wagner's concept of "neutral mutation space", discussed in this volume by William Wimsatt, is illustrative -- it is doubtful that any of these developments necessitate substantive changes in extant theories of functions. This is so, at any rate, for at least one account of functions that has been in the literature since the early 2000s.

In Norms of Nature: Naturalism and the Nature of Functions[1] (hereafter, NN) I argue that there is one true theory of functions. I defend a version of Cummins' systemic capacity (SC) functions, and I argue that the heir to Wright's view, the theory of selected effects (SE) functions, is fatally flawed. Among the claims I defend, the following are most relevant:

  • Contrary to the alleged opposition between (a) and (b) above, there is only one true theory of functions. The theory of SC subsumes all the features of SE functions that can be preserved and rejects those that cannot, including alleged norms of performance (ch. 3, NN).
  • The theory of SC functions avoids alleged counterexamples by restricting its application to hierarchical systems and by requiring the specification of systemic mechanisms implementing systematic capacities (chs. 2, 4, NN).
  • The intuition that some functions are normative should not be preserved but rather explained away by appeal to our informed expectations (ch. 6, NN; also Davies 2009[2]).
  • Contrary to appearances, the theory of SE functions is defective because it is non-naturalistic: the ascription of norms of performance is plausible only on the postulation of abstract, non-causal "offices" or "roles" (ch. 5, NN).
  • Contrary to appearances, the theory of SE functions is defective by its own lights because it does not have the internal resources with which to justify the ascription of malfunctions (ch. 7, NN).

I cannot re-defend these claims here. Instead, I will briefly indicate how, given these claims, my view absorbs or refutes most of the theses defended in this volume.[3]

Pluralism: Three essays defend the claim that SC functions, not just SE functions, are required in scientific and especially biological theorizing. These essays take for granted the theoretical importance of SE functions but argue that SC functions are also theoretically indispensible. They do this by pointing to instances in which practicing scientists posit functional properties that cannot be derived from past selective success.

Frédéric Bouchard claims that novel ecological systems often emerge with the potential to evolve via selection. The functions exhibited in such systems, he claims, cannot be explained in terms of past selection, given the system's novelty. Such functions can only be explained by appeal to the capacities of systemic parts.

Robert Brandon claims that evolutionary biology, like mountain geology, requires historical and non-historical generalizations. Biologists generalize about traits that are adaptations, that descend from selectively successful lineages, but they also generalize about traits that are adaptive, that endow the organism with a currently useful capacity. Since it might be theoretically important to determine whether a trait that is adaptive is (or is not) an adaptation, and vice versa, biologists need in their repertoire historical and non-historical concepts of functions.

Huneman claims that the theory of SE functions lacks the resources with which to resolve indeterminacies in the specification of functional properties. Indeterminacy can arise in several ways -- when, e.g., the processes comprising selection are too blunt to enable us to discriminate between competing descriptions of a single selective response. The only strategies for overcoming such indeterminacies, according to Huneman, require the prior ascription of SC functions.

Despite their interest, none of the three makes a successful case for pluralism. Pluralism is plausible only if the theories of SC and SE functions are both viable competitors. The theory of SE functions, however, is demonstrably redundant on the theory of SC functions and hence eliminable.

The theory of SC functions applies to any capacity of any hierarchically organized system. It applies to the capacity of a system to produce some effect -- e.g., the capacity of an assembly line to assemble n-number of items per day. But it also applies to the capacity of a system to change, or remain the same, over time. Consider a population and its capacity to evolve over a specific period of time. If it evolved as an effect of natural selection, the population will comprise two or more selectively relevant components: the category of organisms with relatively greater reproductive output, caused by certain traits, and the categories without those traits. These are the functionally relevant components insofar as differences in their reproductive outputs implement the capacity of the population to evolve.

This strategy iterates inward. If we wish to discover the SC functions of components contributing positively to evolutionary change, we focus on the first component and analyze into it: we identify traits of the specified category that contributed to relatively higher reproduction. We may, at this point, attribute SC functions to high-level capacities such as running speed, sexual attractiveness, etc. If the goal is to discover functions of lower-level traits, such the circulatory system, or the functions of still lower traits, such as the heart, we iterate still further (ch. 3, NN).

Although much more can be (and has been) said to flesh out this view, three comments are important here. (i) The typical response to my claim that SE functions can be eliminated in favor of SC functions is that SC functions leave no room for malfunctions. But I have already argued that the theory of SE functions is devoid of the resources with which to justify the ascription of malfunctions (ch. 7, NN), and, even if selected malfunctions did exist, they would be abstract, non-causal properties inconsistent with a naturalistic orientation (ch. 5, NN). (ii) It is a misleading to describe SC functions as "ahistorical", as Bouchard and Brandon do. The theory of SC functions of course applies to present systemic capacities but, as the above sketch shows, it also applies to historical systemic changes. (iii) If I am right -- if SE functions are eliminable in favor of SC functions -- then Brandon's confident conclusions -- "neither type of functional analysis is reducible to the other" (p. 102) and "functional monism in biology is unsupportable" (p. 103) -- are incorrect.

Organisms and Artifacts: Unlike pluralists who insist on preserving both kinds of functions, Françoise Longy defends a sophisticated etiological theory with wide scope. Primacy is given to claim (b) above -- to the shaping powers of selection -- and the theory is then extended to artifacts. By contrast, Pieter Vermaas and Wybo Houkes give primacy to claim (a), to mechanisms. They begin with a sophisticated theory of artifact functions and extend it to biological traits.

Despite the resourcefulness with which Longy extends her etiological theory to artifacts, I do not think any theory that requires past selective success can be correct. The world is filled with functions that in no way derive from selection.

Several cases are illustrative (including those discussed by Bouchard, Brandon, and Huneman). SC functions emerge when, e.g., selection is neutralized by non-selective processes. Imagine a population in which drift events neutralize extant selective pressures over several generations. We can explain the relevant systemic capacity -- the population's capacity to persist unchanged -- by applying the theory of SC functions. As in the sketch above, we analyze into the population, identify systemic components responsible for the population's stasis, and attribute SC functions accordingly. The attributed functions emerge despite the absence of causally efficacious selection. So selection cannot be a necessary condition for the existence of functions (ch.s 3, 4, NN).

Although Longy's etiological theory should be resisted, her criticisms of the theory proposed by Vermaas and Houkes (V-H) should be embraced. V-H propose a theory of functions for technical artifacts: "material objects that are used, and perhaps designed, for practical purposes." (p. 214) Artifact functions exist relative to a network of relations among intentional agents -- relative to shared "plans" and justified beliefs among those who design, produce, or consume artifacts. The function of a hammer is to enable organisms like us to hammer only if we justifiably believe hammers have this capacity and there exists a plan that specifies a goal for the use of hammers, etc.

Now, the expressed aim of V-H's essay is to show that their theory, extended to biological systems, commits us to the unorthodox implication that biological functions are mind-dependent. I think, however, we should worry less about the implications of their view and more about the question, what is their theory a theory of?

As Longy points out, V-H's theory seems to be an account of the social conditions under which intentional agents assert and accept the attribution of functions, and those are conditions that need not track the reality of actual functional properties.

Indeed, entire communities of intentional agents can share beliefs that are justified but systemically false. Consider religious rituals such as prayer. Praying is a ritual designed and performed by material beings, and thus qualifies as a "technical artifact". It also appears to satisfy V-H's theory: sincere believers believe, with what they regard as justification, that praying has certain effects, that there is a plan that specifies the goals of prayer, etc. Yet, if the universe is such that none of the requisite theological assumptions is true, then none of the functions justified by V-H's theory exists.

This problem is quite general. Medical procedures are sometimes believed, on the basis of scientific trials, to possess artifact functions they do not have; educators sometimes justifiably attribute artifact functions to pedagogical techniques that are ineffectual; college administrators claim, with what they take to be justification, that curricular "innovations" will increase student learning even when the end result is academic drivel; etc.

V-H appear alive to this worry. They confess that their view is "not an ontological theory." (p. 222) But this only makes the worry more acute. If a proposed theory of functions is not a theory of the ontological conditions for the existence of functions, it is not a theory of functions. My guess is that their theory, rather than an account of functions, is instead a sociological theory of function attributions. It is an account of the origins of epistemic and perhaps also legal and ethical norms that emerge among designers, producers, and consumers of artifacts. If so, and if what they say is defensible, then it may help explain the source of our intuitions -- mistaken intuitions, on my view -- that biological traits can malfunction (ch. 6, NN).

Levels, Development, Organization: Jean Gayon argues that, between SC and SE functions, the former have broader scope. Oxygen molecules have clear SC functions but, insofar as they are not subject to selection, they cannot acquire SE functions. I agree. The theory of SC functions has wide scope and applies to items affected by selection as well as those not so affected (chs. 3, 4, NN). Gayon's observations are consistent with my view that the theory of SE functions, understood as a competitor to the theory of SC functions, ought to be eliminated.

There is, however, one point of disagreement. Gayon, like several others in this volume, characterizes SC functions as "non-realistic". There is, however, nothing un- or anti- or quasi-realistic about SC functions. As I develop the theory (pp. 23-29, NN), SC functions can exist only in real systems with real systemic components possessed of real systemic capacities.

No doubt it is the relativity of SC functions that leads some theorists to infer that SC functions must be mind-dependent and, in consequence, less than fully real. But the inference is unsound. SC functions are indeed relative to a higher-level capacity of a specified system. The function of the heart is to circulate blood relative to the function of the circulatory system, and the function of the circulatory system is relative to a whole-organism capacity, e.g., to maintain life. But all this would be true even if there were no minds! Living things, for some period of time, in fact possess the capacity to remain alive; the circulatory system of those organisms, relative to their capacity to remain alive, in fact contributes specific systemic effects; and so on. So the inference from systemic relativity to non-realism is spurious. (There is, moreover, a parallel relativity in SE functions, since selection is always environment-relative.)

Denis Walsh, in a wide-ranging essay, attempts to resuscitate quasi-Aristotelian teleology in the context of recent work in evolutionary development. Explanations in evo-devo appear to quantify over high-level capacities, including an oganism's pursuit of goals. Explanations in virtually every other area of modern biology, by contrast, are methodologically committed to the explanatory hegemony of lower-level mechanisms. An organism's apparent purposes are explained away by appeal to relations among mechanisms operating beneath the level of the whole organism.

Against this status quo, Walsh argues that there exists a class of "emergent teleological" explanations. These, he says, are complementary to mechanistic explanations. They do not posit any causal capacities beyond those belonging to instantiating mechanisms, but they nonetheless are autonomous and theoretically necessary. "Every phenomenon has a complete, mechanistic explanation, but not every genuine explanation is mechanistic. There also exists a class of emergent teleological explanations that appeal to the goals or purposes of a system." (p. 44)

The burden on Walsh, then, is to make the case that there are autonomous teleological explanations -- explanations that, despite the existence of complete mechanistic explanations, are nonetheless required in theories of evolutionary development.

As I understand him, Walsh reasons as follows. Theories in evo-devo involve two classes of invariant generalizations. Some quantify over behavioral trajectories (t) that conduce to the fulfillment of certain goals (g); these generalizations are integral to teleological explanations. Others quantify over low level mechanisms (m) and the behavioral trajectories (t) instantiated by those mechanisms; these are used in mechanistic explanations. The crucial premise is that these two kinds of generalizations are descriptively non-equivalent, in this sense: generalizations quantifying over <t,g> do not track, and not tracked by, generalizations quantifying over <m,t>. Why? Because the former are multiply realized by the latter, given the behavioral plasticity of organisms. In consequence, for any token explanation of an organism's behavior that appeals to some goal, the actual low-level mechanisms involved cannot be specified, and, conversely, for any token explanation of a behavioral trajectory by appeal to some mechanism, the actual organismic goal cannot be specified. Hence the non-equivalence of teleological and mechanistic explanations.

If this is indeed the nub of Walsh's argument, his conclusion should be resisted. Let us grant that some generalizations concerning goals are indeed multiply realized by generalizations concerning the implementing mechanisms. It is nonetheless false that, for any token explanation, the relevant generalizations are descriptively non-equivalent. To the contrary, as we analyze inward -- as our explanation increases in information and thus power -- our initial generalizations are replaced with a single, more-restricted, and thus more informative generalization <mn,g>.

To accomplish this, we apply the explanatory scheme of the theory of SC functions. Begin with the capacity of a token organism to fulfill some goal. To explain this, we apply <t,g>. But if multiple mechanisms can indeed implement a single trajectory, as Walsh insists, then our explanation at this point is obviously incomplete. To maximize the power of our explanation of an organism's fulfilling its goal, we must apply the second kind of generalization, <m,t>, and furthermore we must identify the specific mechanism implementing the behavioral trajectory and thus the goal-conducing behavior. We need, in short, to specify the causally salient mn for the specific bit of behavior we are trying to explain. (If we do not do this, we settle for an explanation we know to be informationally incomplete.) The result is a highly informative explanation that appeals to the restricted generalization -- and it is an invariant generalization, despite its restrictedness -- that quantifies over the specific mechanism mn and its instantiation of the organism's capacity to fulfill the specified goal.

The alleged non-equivalence, I conclude, does not exist. Of course, many actual scientific explanations are less than complete, given constraints on time, evidence, and computational power. Sometimes we are forced, and in some cases it suffices, to settle for explanations that appeal to abstract invariance relations and ignore causal details. But the mere fact that many of our explanations, in the face of practical constraints, are incomplete does not show that incomplete explanations are ever theoretically required.

The most interesting essay is by Wimsatt. He asks the lovely question: which theory of functions best accounts for change, or for resistance to change, in the deep organizational architecture of organisms? His answer increases the plausibility of my claim that there is just one true theory of functions.

Traits that develop early and constitute the more fundamental portions of an organism's architecture tend to be both entrenched and robust. They are entrenched insofar as subsequent developments depend on them; they are robust insofar as their functional effects tend to be redundant. Robustness, moreover, reinforces entrenchment: there will be selective pressure toward redundancy in the functional effects of entrenched traits, given their critical role in subsequent development.

Entrenchment and robustness have several crucial consequences. They help explain why offspring tend to resemble parents in their fundamental architecture. They also explain why changes deep in an organism's architecture are more resistant to change than less entrenched traits. It is unlikely, e.g., that arthropods (with an exoskeletal body plan) will evolve via selection in the direction of chordates (endoskeletons), because the requisite mutations would alter traits deep in the organism's developing architecture. If such mutations were sufficient to defeat the redundancy involved, the likely effect would be a loss of viability.

Here, then, is Wimsatt's claim concerning functions: for traits entrenched in an organism's architecture, the theory of SE functions has little traction. This is because entrenched traits are relatively insulated from selection. By contrast, the theory of SC functions does not require past selective success. They can accrue to traits deep in organismic architecture whether or not selection can touch them.

This means that, with respect to the most foundational traits in the biological realm, the theory of SE functions is all but impotent while the theory of SC functions is fruitful! This confirms the claim that the theory of SC functions is not only broader in scope, but that SC functions are more fundamental (ch. 3, NN).

Wimsatt does not make the stronger claim that SE functions are redundant on, and thus eliminable in favor of, SC functions. His view appears closer to that of the pluralists than to mine, since he seems to regard SC and SE as competitors. Still, Wimsatt's observation that the theory of SE functions applies mainly to relatively shallow biological traits should give pause to all defenders of SE functions, pluralists included.

Epilogue: With a nice editorial touch, this volume ends with an epilogue by one of the two philosophers who have on their conscience more than 40 years of debate over functions! In his suggestive remarks, Larry Wright offers emendations to his original views and gestures towards what he takes to be the fundamental intellectual challenge associated with our concepts of teleology and functions: the nature of agency.

Wright's main emendations are: (i) not all consequence etiologies are teleological; only some etiological explanations appeal in an integral way to the values or competencies of agents; (ii) genuinely teleological explanations appeal in an integral way to the values and competencies of relevant agents. Wright also offers a diagnostic suggestion in light of the difference between (i) and (ii). Our concept of agency, he says, is so convoluted that our intellectual tradition has succumbed to "legendary struggles" to understand the nature and significance of agency. And these struggles, he suggests, probably explain why in any particular case it is so difficult to tease (i) and (ii) apart.

Wright also remarks, here and on his website that he is working on a book on agency, on the concept of a reason in agency. That is a work that theorists of functions will want to study.

[1] 2001 MIT Press.

[2] Subjects of the World: Darwin’s Rhetoric and the Study of Agency in Nature, University of Chicago Press, 2009.

[3] Two interesting essays in this volume I do not discuss are Carl Gillett’s, since it is about functionalism in theories of mind rather than theories of functions, and Carl Craver’s, since his view overlaps mine.