Future People: A Moderate Consequentialist Account of Our Obligations to Future Generations

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Tim Mulgan, Future People: A Moderate Consequentialist Account of Our Obligations to Future Generations, Oxford University Press, 2006, 402pp., $80.00 (hbk), ISBN 019928220X.

Reviewed by Rivka Weinberg, Scripps College


What we owe to our own children, to the children of others, to our descendants, to the descendants of others, to future distant generations in our community, and to the future distant generation of distant others is a question few moral theories fully address. This glaring oversight is finally remedied by Tim Mulgan's Future People, an in-depth analysis of our obligations to future people, and the implications this analysis has for the plausibility of moral theories. Mulgan's extremely clear style makes Future People accessible and enjoyable. This book is timely, important, and should be read by all who take moral interest in others (and even more so by those who don't).

Mulgan begins with a cluster of intuitively plausible claims regarding our obligations to future people and argues that contemporary moral theory cannot accommodate all of them. He proposes that a version of rule consequentialism, however, is consistent with the cluster of plausible claims regarding future generations. In the second half of the book, he considers public policy implications of intergenerational justice, including how partial compliance affects individual obligations and public policy. Just as in the first half of the book, Mulgan begins with a cluster of intuitively plausible claims about public policy regarding future generations and argues that only rule consequentialism can accommodate them all. The book concludes with intriguing reflections on distinguishing "realms" of morality (namely, reciprocity and necessity), a distinction which Mulgan argues is important to the continuing viability of moral theory.

Individual obligations to future generations, Mulgan argues, must accommodate three "decisive intuitions:" It is wrong to gratuitously make future people suffer, it is wrong for the present generation to gratuitously make future generations suffer, and there is no general obligation to reproduce or not to reproduce.

Mulgan argues that non-consequentialist theories are inconsistent with the first two fundamental intuitions because, due to Parfit's Non-Identity Problem, they are unable to deem it wrong to cause future people to suffer gratuitously. The Non-Identity Problem challenges us to explain what is wrong with policies or decisions that seem to harm future people, but which are also necessary for the worthwhile existences of these same future people, since the policies and decisions themselves determine future identities (by taking time or not taking time, thereby affecting which people meet, when they meet, and, thereby, which sperm fertilizes which egg). So long as future people do not have lives not worth living, it seems impossible to claim that these seemingly harmful policies or decisions harmed them. And where there's no harm, non-consequentialist theories have a hard time establishing a wrong. This poses a deep challenge, Parfit thought, to all person-affecting moral theories. In the more than twenty years since Parfit posed the Non-Identity Problem, various solutions have been proposed, but Mulgan is, I think, correct to say that none have been completely satisfying. He also points out that the Non-Identity Problem poses no challenge to consequentialist theories because consequentialism defines wrongs in terms of states of affairs rather than in terms of identified persons harmed.

Mulgan argues that, due to the Non-Identity Problem, contractualist theories cannot account for two out of the three decisive reproductive intuitions. I find this puzzling because although contractualist theories are person-affecting, some contractualist theories are only person-affecting in a general sense, i.e. in terms of how policies or acts affect people in general, regardless of identity. The Non-Identity Problem challenges narrow person-affecting theories by showing that we cannot identify the person harmed by seeming reproductive wrongs. Theories that deem an act wrong insofar as it affects a particular, identified person, are narrow person-affecting theories. They must answer to the Non-Identity Problem. Wide person-affecting theories, however, avoid the Non-Identity problem entirely. Rawlsian contractualism, for example, determines principles of justice by comparing how rule x affects the people that exist under x with how rule y affects those who live under y. Thus, Rawlsian contractualists need not claim that particular, identified children have been harmed by reproductive negligence. Instead, they can claim that children are wronged when their parents (or others) don't abide by just reproductive principles (principles arrived at via wide rather than narrow person-affecting considerations). It is therefore not clear that contractualists cannot account for Mulgan's first two decisive reproductive intuitions.

Contractualist theories may run into other difficulties with reproductive justice, chiefly, as Mulgan explains, because the reciprocity that serves as a foundation for contractualist theory seems inapplicable to intergenerational justice. We are affected by our contemporaries and by past generations but we can only affect our contemporaries and future generations. It therefore seems impossible to construct reciprocal agreements between the present generation and future generations. In order to do so, we may assume ties of sentiment between generations, as Rawls does in A Theory of Justice, but Mulgan persuasively argues that changing the motivation condition in this way is both ad hoc and unpredictable. Another possibility is to make the contract more hypothetical still, and argue that the present generation ought to act toward future generations just as they would have wanted their ancestors to act with respect to them (as Nagel and Parfit argue). This may be metaphysically tricky, but it need not push the theory back into Non-Identity difficulties, as Mulgan claims it does, since, as a wide person-affecting theory, Rawlsian contractualism is not subject to the Non-Identity Problem. A third possibility, which I have argued elsewhere, is to assume an intrapersonal contract wherein one selects rules under which one will both procreate and be born. (This third possibility guards against the problem that the assumption of existence may create, namely, being motivated towards very small, very well off populations. Since the rules we select constrain our own reproductive activity, we will be wary of overly restrictive rules).

Having rejected deontological moral theories on the basis of the Non-Identity Problem, Mulgan then turns to consequentialist theories to determine whether they can account for the decisive reproductive intuitions. He argues that, although they can easily accommodate the first two intuitions, they may run into trouble with the third. Consequentialist theories can easily accommodate the first two intuitions because they require agents to produce the best overall state of affairs, which, presumably, precludes a state of affairs containing gratuitous suffering. But, because consequentialists require agents to maximize good consequences overall, agents may often find themselves required to refrain from reproduction when their resources, if redirected away from reproduction, could contribute to a higher level of overall good. Similarly, agents may find themselves required to reproduce if doing so could contribute to a higher level of overall good than their alternative courses of action. Consequentialist theories may also sometimes force us to avoid "sub-optimal" reproduction, in violation of what Mulgan argues is the intuitively plausible reproductive principle permitting sub-optimal reproduction. Seeking a less demanding consequentialism, Mulgan turns to rule consequentialism which, he argues, is limited in the demands upon which it can insist because the cost of inculcating counter-intuitive ideals is usually too steep to be worthwhile. This argument is invoked repeatedly throughout the book, serving as a constraint on the rules that rule consequentialism can require. It can seem somewhat suspect, however, to argue that rule consequentialism's advantage is its ability to accommodate deeply held intuitions when the reason it has this ability is because intuitively challenging rules are deemed too costly to inculcate. It would perhaps be more persuasive if the cost of inculcating intuitively challenging rules were demonstrated and measured against the possible gains. Mulgan's rule consequentialism claims to adopt the principles that would be judged as optimal by someone who had internalized those principles and was raised in a society where most others had internalized them as well. When we consider the possibility of raising a generation of children on the demanding kind of consequentialism that seems counter-intuitive to us, it is not clear that children so raised would find it extremely difficult to accept them. Indeed, they might find them deeply intuitive. (Mill seems to have thought along these lines). And, even if teaching new and intuitively challenging rules is very costly, it is not clear that it would not be worth the cost.

Cost of inculcating counter-intuitive rules proves very important to Mulgan's discussion of public policy regarding intergenerational justice as well. Mulgan considers a set of intuitively plausible reproductive public policies, including rules requiring consideration of future generations' interests; leaving future generations no worse off than yourself and, if possible, better off; and not depleting resources they will need. He also tries to accommodate intuitively plausible personal and group liberty constraints on those obligations, so long as this is not too burdensome for future generations. Maximization of the size or happiness of future generations is not required. This set of intuitions regarding reproductive public policy and intergenerational justice is accommodated by rule consequentialism largely because the costs of inculcating counter-intuitive rules is deemed too high to make doing so worthwhile. Perhaps that is true but, as argued, it is not easy to persuade the reader of this without considerable evidence. It is also not especially surprising to find that a theory that rejects counter-intuitive rules can accommodate most of our current intuitions.

As with individual reproductive morality, Mulgan rejects person-affecting theories of reproductive public policy and intergenerational justice on the basis of the Non-Identity Problem. Presumably, due to the Non-Identity Problem, we would not be required to refrain from depleting resources that future generations will need or to leave future generations better off, or at least no worse off, than we are. Aside from the problem of applying the Non-Identity Problem to both wide and narrow person-affecting theories, there is the general worry of placing so much argumentative weight on a puzzle that is itself counter-intuitive. That is a lot of weight for a counter-intuitive problem to bear, particularly since the book's line of argument is not favorably disposed toward counter-intuitive principles. It will also not convince those who think that the Non-Identity Problem has already been solved (be they right or wrong about that), nor will it convince those who favor a wide person-affecting theory.

Nonetheless, Mulgan ultimately arrives at what many would likely regard as a reasonable principle of individual reproductive morality, within the context of a public policy that values individual autonomy. His "Flexible Lexical Rule" permits, but does not require, reproduction so long as one is reasonably sure that one's child's life will rise above the "lexical level" (defined as a reasonably successful autonomous life, relative to one's culture) and very sure that her life will be worth living. Perhaps this principle could be more persuasively argued for directly rather than through a rule consequentialist lens.

Mulgan not only considers reproductive public policy and intergenerational justice under full compliance, but he also considers these issues internationally and under various conditions of partial compliance. Considerations of human nature, and the culturally context-dependent nature of individual projects are taken to argue in favor of permitting prioritizing one's group and in favor of the value of group autonomy. But considerations of need and rectification of past group wrongs are taken to dampen the prioritization of one's group to some degree. Forms of future government are considered, as is the difference in policy that can result from taking an optimistic or pessimistic view of the future. Democracy is argued to be best at furthering well-being. As Mulgan admits, these futuristic discussions can involve considerable speculation, but the speculation can still be, and is, fruitful and interesting.

Ultimately, Mulgan concludes that Rule Consequentialism becomes too demanding under conditions of partial compliance in areas other than individual reproduction (although why the inculcability factor cannot combat this problem as it does for Mulgan numerous times along the way is unclear). He therefore proposes splitting morality into two realms. The Realm of Reciprocity is, he argues, applicable to those positioned to act as autonomous agents in the moral community and best governed by rule consequentialism. Individual reproduction falls under this realm. The Realm of Necessity is applicable to physical needs of those outside the moral community (needs to which those within the moral community attempt to attend) and not readily subject to prerogatives or constraints. Mulgan argues that the Realm of Necessity is best governed by simple consequentialism. Relations with future generations outside our moral community fall under this realm. The two realms may seem to correspond to virtue theory's justice and benevolence, or deontological ethics' respect and aid.

Mulgan has written a timely and important book of incredibly impressive scope and interest. He argues in favor of highly reasonable reproductive rules and his intriguing book will no doubt be of great value to this neglected area of ethics.